A Theory of Secession: The Case for Political Self-Determination

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Christopher Heath Wellman, A Theory of Secession: The Case for Political Self-Determination, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 199pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521849152.

Reviewed by Christopher W. Morris, University of Maryland, College Park


Christopher Heath Wellman's new book defends a controversial thesis in a novel way. He defends secession and does so in a bold manner that will set his book apart from other such defenses. His thesis is that "any group has a moral right to secede as long as its political divorce will leave it and the remainder state in a position to perform the requisite political functions" (p. 1). It's not clear what the practical implications of this right would be, but the theoretical claim is bold and controversial. Defenders of the modern state will be sceptical, as will many thinkers who have recently written about secession. I find myself sympathetic to his thesis but worried about different parts of the argument.

Wellman's case for the right to secede is conditional on the value of self-determination, one of the features that makes his case so interesting. Many supporters of secession defend secession from the value or principle of freedom of association (or a more fundamental right to liberty). Wellman argues that freedom of association must be qualified, at least if we are to have states. They must be territorially contiguous if they are to perform their functions. He offers an argument for the legitimacy of states, one developed in earlier writings, and on the basis of this argument concludes that freedom of association is limited and thus unable to ground a right of groups to secede. I'll comment on the argument for states below.

The central chapter of the book (ch. 3) defends secession from the value of self-determination. This case is available to defenders of states as long as the right to secession is conditional on the new smaller political societies being able to perform the requisite political functions. The remaining chapters take up a number of important questions. Wellman replies to President Lincoln's (ten) important arguments against secession (ch. 4). The next chapter examines nationalist arguments for secession and concludes that cultural features or values are not central to the case for secession, a claim that will please many and outrage others (ch. 5). He considers the charge that a right to secede will undermine democracies by empowering minorities in ways that allow them to threaten and to exploit others (ch. 6). Questions about international law are taken up in a penultimate chapter (ch. 7). And Wellman concludes with some brief optimistic remarks, somewhat surprising in the post-9/11 world as I shall note.

Wellman's particular case for the right of groups to secede starts from the assumption that states can be legitimate. This thesis is controversial to some, but of course its denial makes the case for secession much easier. One of the strengths of Wellman's book is that he defends secession from a statist position. His case for statism -- his term, others using it primarily for purposes of abuse -- is part of his challenge to the attempt to defend secession from the value of freedom of association. The latter, he argues, must be restricted if states are to perform their tasks. Wellman's case for the state, developed a decade or more ago, is "Samaritan". He tells a story of two people, Antonio and Bathsheba (hereafter referred to by their more familiar names, A and B). The former picks up a hitchhiker, B, while driving. He seems to be a bit of a grouch and offers only to take her to the next town, Pleasantville, and under no condition anywhere farther. B agrees and is very grateful. Pleasantville turns out surprisingly to be a rather Hobbesian place, chaotic and horrible, with dangerous gangs destroying whatever they can find. Not surprisingly, B implores A to take her away.

Wellman rightly thinks that A has a duty to do so. The duty cannot be grounded in consent or to A's special relationship to B. And it cannot be derived from norms like Mill's harm principle (for A would not be harming B). Wellman argues that the duty (and correlative right to assistance) is samaritan. Given B's extreme peril and the fact that A can assist her easily at no unreasonable cost to himself, he has a samaritan duty. Wellman thinks that "the moral relations of political legitimacy are echoic of those between Antonio and Bathsheba… [C]itizens have no claim-right to be free from political coercion when this will leave others in a condition of political instability… [P]olitical society is the only vehicle with which people can escape the perils of the state of nature" (p. 13).

I have worries about this account of political legitimacy or of the state's legitimacy. Wellman thinks this account "explains why states may permissibly coerce citizens without their consent and, in so doing, explains why we do not have a perfectly general and absolute right to freedom of association" (p. 32). Certainly it is unlikely that the samaritan account could ground the normal claims of states to authority (much less sovereignty) or associated claims of political obligation (i.e., the duty of citizens to obey all valid laws)[1]. At most this account could ground a justification of coercion. Further, I should think that this justification would cover only coercion necessary to prevent certain harms to people (both citizens and others in the territory of the state). It's hard to see how this justification would apply, for instance, to public subsidies to higher education or to public provision of health care. Wellman's criticisms of rival accounts are unpersuasive. But there are similarities between his story and influential neo-Kantian ones (including Kant's own political philosophy). So his statism will not strike everyone as controversial.

The case Wellman makes for the right of some states to coerce those on its territory is sufficient to set up his project of defending the right to secede given the value of self-determination: "Anyone who properly values self-determination should defend the right to secede whenever both the separatist group and the remainder state would be able and willing to perform the requisite political functions" (pp. 34-5). His view here is not widely shared but he notes that some philosophers -- Beran, Copp, Gauthier, Philpott -- defend a view like his. Wellman thinks we have "deontological" reasons for respecting group autonomy (p. 38). Part of the attraction of this kind of view, he thinks, is that it can ground the way in which our duties to respect autonomy are owed to particular individuals (or groups).

Wellman thinks of group autonomy as something that is exercised by "a collective as a whole" (p. 41). We have some duties, and they are owed to the group. These duties may bind even if other alternative courses of action (e.g., abridging the group's autonomy) would be better for the members or everyone. Wellman considers three possible explanations of the reasons for respecting group autonomy (value-collectivism, individual autonomy, individual well-being) and rejects them all. He argues that denying the deontological reason for respecting group autonomy is not a plausible option. If one were to do so, one could not explain "the reasons to respect a just state's sovereignty", or why colonizing others would be wrong even if it were to improve their lot, and, most importantly, "the normative case for democracy seems adequate only if we grant the deontological reasons to respect group self-determination" (p. 52). Wellman thinks that the case for democracy is importantly non-instrumental and that this position is widely held: "the prevailing view is that people have a right to democratic governance even if better results could be achieved via undemocratic means" (p. 53). I suppose I am one of the few sceptics. The instrumental case for most forms of democracy seems to me quite strong, even if the flaws of all of our democracies are now well-known. And democracy does have some intrinsic merits. But I am not inclined to think that the latter would always outweigh the value of alternative republican systems -- less democratic ones -- that promised better results. (One only has to think of all of the institutions in our republican forms of political society which are not obviously democratic -- e.g., in the US, the Federal Reserve, the higher courts, the Cabinet.) I do not necessarily reject the thesis that group autonomy understood as Wellman does is something that should be respected. But the case for it is somewhat disappointing.

I shan't comment on several of the interesting chapters that make up the rest of the book. The analysis of Lincoln's arguments against secession is instructive (ch. 4). Wellman defends a "functional account of secession", one which focuses on the capacities of the post-secession political societies to carry out their functions. He thinks that nationalism and associated phenomena mislead us into thinking of secession as culturally justified. He is not wrong in arguing that the capacity to govern well and to carry out certain tasks efficiently is a condition on just secession, but he misspeaks in concluding that "cultural features are not central to secessionist conflicts" (p. 4). He attacks some nationalist theses that are formulated in a way that is implausibly strong ("each nation has a right to political self-determination" [p. 97], "all and only nations have a right to secede" [p. 112]); the more moderate position defended by Margalit and Raz might escape his criticisms. Cultural factors seem more important than Wellman credits, but he is right to think that just secession is conditional on the new political units being able to carry out their tasks effectively.

Wellman's short concluding chapter, "The Velvet Transformation", makes a prediction: "We are not far from the day when political theorists and international actors respect the importance of political self-determination, and when that day arrives, groups will not vote in favor of secession" (p. 181, italics in the original). The optimism is striking, at least after 9/11 -- that is, after the US's reaction to the attacks of 9/11 and the effects this reaction will have on the state system. Modern states arose in the first place in large part out of fear of being conquered by more powerful neighbors, the state proving to be more efficient militarily and in some respects economically than its late medieval alternatives. Groups desiring to secede will think twice in a world where small states are more vulnerable to predators or bullies. Post-1989 Europe seemed to be a place where secessionist groups might fare better than they had before. But no major European state will tolerate secession of any part that would weaken it and leave it more vulnerable than before. Perhaps the day that Wellman thinks is not far will come one day, but I don't expect to see it.

Wellman's discussion is quite abstract or removed from the details of history and current events, even by the standards of contemporary philosophy. This is necessary given the type of theses he is examining and defending. But it's not clear what the practical implications of his right of secession might be. Secession is conditional on the new states being able to perform the requisite political functions. What these turn out to be will, of course, constrain secessions. Were Catalonia to leave Spain, the remainder state would be considerably poorer, and were Alberta to leave Canada, the remainder state would have very little oil. Were Hawaii to leave the US or Alsace-Lorraine France, the remainder states would feel more vulnerable to attack. We need to know not only what political functions states must perform but at what level they must do so before we can estimate which secessionist groups might permissibly secede. Further, the future is hard to predict. The break-up of Czechoslovakia had little effect on European politics, but Chechnya's departure from the Russian Republic or Tibet's departure from China might have considerable repercussions as other republics tried to follow suit. More needs to be said before the practical implications can be estimated, as Wellman would not deny. 

Those who are sceptical at the outset of the legitimacy of states may already be comfortable with the right to secede. One of the reasons that some are sceptical has to do with an essential feature of modern states, the territorial nature of their governance or jurisdiction: states claim authority not over persons (or citizens) per se, but principally persons who find themselves in the state's territory. This may change, but it is now an essential feature of states. Now secession, as opposed to emigration, necessarily challenges the state's territorial rule. What secessionists propose is to take some of a state's territory and to make it their own. This is different from proposing to take some of a state's property or merely to take some of one's property (in land). While the territorial nature of states has been noted in the recent literature, especially in discussions of secession, it's not clear how much progress has been made in understanding the basis for the claims to states to govern territorially or to control the territory they claim. It's one thing to think oneself justified in preventing killers and brigands from harming others. It's another to claim that one may coerce anyone who happens to be on a particular territory -- or worse, to claim that one has quite general authority over them. How does carrying out certain functions -- making people more secure in their persons and possessions, for instance -- give one this extensive territorial power? Perplexity about the territorial nature of states may be cause for some scepticism of statism, and this scepticism may make one friendly to rights to secede.

A Theory of Secession is a good book and a good defense of the right of groups to secede. Much that Christopher Wellman says is controversial, but this is a topic about which there is now little agreement.[2]



[1] Wellman notes a distinction between political obligation and political legitimacy (p. 16, n. 18). He suggests there that legitimacy implies a right to exist and a right to force people to obey the rules (or to leave). A more thorough discussion of legitimacy would have been useful. I should note that he does offer one in another book, Is There a Duty to Obey the Law?, co-written with John Simmons (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005), which I have not yet carefully studied.

[2] I am grateful to David Lefkowitz for comments on a draft.