A Theory of the Absolute

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Benedikt Paul Göcke, A Theory of the Absolute, Palgrave Macmillan, 2014, 239pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781137412812.

Reviewed by Francis Coolidge, Jr., Loyola University New Orleans



This book has two chief aims. First, it seeks to demonstrate that physicalism (the thesis that only physical entities exist) is not a tenable metaphysics. Second, it wants to show that an adequate metaphysics entails the existence of the Absolute. The two aims converge as Benedikt Göcke argues both that physicalism fails to account for subjectivity and that a sufficient account of both the physical and the subjective (what he terms the soul) entails a metaphysical ground of both domains. Göcke takes the physical, the soul, and the ground of these two domains to be the three fundamental terms constituting empirical reality. Since he maintains that the totality of empirical reality is itself contingent rather than necessary, he concludes this reality requires an ultimate ground (the Absolute) that necessarily must be.

As the summary above might suggest, Göcke also purports to demonstrate the "existence" of God. For the Absolute, in religious terms, could be called "God." He observes many analytic philosophers are atheists because they are persuaded by physicalism. Hence, the critique of physicalism and the argument for the Absolute is also a defense of theism. Although in chapter nine Göcke is careful to distinguish between theological and philosophical versions of theism, his entire argument is assiduously framed so that the philosophical account of the Absolute is compatible with the faith of Christian monotheism.

This book is lucidly and pugnaciously argued. It is both a rare pleasure and slow to read because it offers a systematic and ambitious treatment of the aforementioned metaphysical topics. I regret I must neglect to discuss some key aspects of the work; nor can this review do justice to the text's subtleties and complexity. My aim is to offer a topical flyover and critique, including questions intended to be useful for both the author and potential reader.

The volume is evidently written, however, for those who are already persuaded or will grant for the sake of argument that possible worlds structure the ontological. Thus, in chapter two Göcke introduces, virtually without discussion, the key premises of his modal metaphysics: conceivability is essentially concerned with possibility, possibility is analyzable in terms of possible worlds, and the actual world is a possible world.

Chapters two through five develop and defend an actualist interpretation of possible worlds (the position that only one possible world is actual) in light of Göcke's modal rationalism. Modal rationalism is the thesis that there is a priori knowledge of possibilities and necessities; thus, the actual world and other possible worlds are structured according to reason. Göcke's modal rationalism enables him both in chapter six to clarify the metaphysical meaning of physicalism and subsequently in chapter seven to unfold arguments that purport to demonstrate its insufficiency.

In parts two and three of this review I focus on some interrelated difficulties. It is not clear that Göcke can sufficiently distinguish the actual (empirical) world from other possible worlds. Thus, I am not persuaded that we have a priori knowledge of possibilities and necessities. Hence, his refutation of physicalism and his arguments for the contingency of empirical reality (and thus the necessary "existence" of the Absolute) are not fully compelling.

Chapters ten and eleven articulate Göcke's case for a triadic structure of empirical reality (comprised of possible worlds, souls, and their ground) and his reasoning that this totality must be grounded in the Absolute. Yet his arguments for the nature of the Absolute entail the claim that the being of empirical reality and the Absolute cannot be properly distinguished. I do not see this contention to be entirely convincing.


Göcke's development of modal actualism follows his rejection (in chapter two) of both "ersatzer" accounts of possible worlds and modal realism because neither can account for particulars possibly being different from the way what they actually are. But his view has a reciprocal problem: although his actualist account of possible worlds can explain how particulars are possible, it is not clear how actual particulars can be different from the way they possibly are. Differently stated, it is not evident how our actual world, insofar as it is actual, can be distinguished from other possible worlds.

Göcke's difficulty emerges as he develops his "presentist" interpretation of modal actualism in chapter four. For Göcke, what ostensibly distinguishes the actual world from possible worlds is that the actual world has a temporal flow. Possible worlds, by contrast, are tenseless. The actual world, however, is nothing above the tensed exemplification of maximally consistent co-exemplifiable essences. Differently formulated, the actual world is the tensed exemplification of essences that comprise tenseless possible worlds. Temporal flow is thus the process of tenseless essences becoming exemplified "now" in the actual world. But exemplification or the process of exemplification cannot be a property of the essences comprising the actual world, because Göcke, following Kant, rejects the view that existence, understood as actuality, is a predicate. Hence, the problem: how can temporal flow be a feature of the actual world, since the actual world is the totality of the properties of its exemplified essences?

Conversely, if the actual world is a possible world, how are we to conceptualize the actual world as possible? For temporal flow is not a feature of the tenseless essences that could possibly be exemplified. Therefore, it is not clear how the actual world can be conceived as a possible world or distinguished as an actual one on the basis of Göcke's modal actualism.

If it is not clear we can conceive of the actual world as a possible world, then it is not evident we have a priori knowledge of the possible, because we cannot adequately grasp how the actual world is differentiated from other possible worlds. Further, if we cannot adequately distinguish the actual from other possibilities, then we are lost at sea in the possible and hence cannot have a priori knowledge of metaphysical necessities. These difficulties call into question the cogency of Göcke's development of modal rationalism in chapter five and thus the force of both his critique of physicalism in chapter seven and his arguments for the contingency of empirical reality in chapter ten.


Göcke's account of modal actualism lays the groundwork for his clarification and critique of physicalism: physicalism is the view that only essences of physical particulars are actually exemplified, and thus exist. Since physicalism must preclude the existence of non-physical particulars, Göcke clarifies physicalism as the view that no actually existing particular can conceptually entail the existence of a subject of experience, for a subject and its qualities are non-physical.

Göcke's critique of physicalism in chapter seven is intricately developed; for the sake of brevity, however, I focus on two points. On the one hand, he argues that the qualities of being a subject (e.g., having unified, or "simple," experience) cannot be identified with the complexity of physical properties or a physical particular. On the other hand, since these qualities cannot be repudiated without absurdly denying human experience, there is an actually existing particular, a human being, whose properties entail the existence of a subject. Hence, physicalism is false.

In chapter eight Göcke unpacks his account of a subject of experience. He contends that to be a subject is to be contingently related to an existing human being, since it is conceivably possible you or I (or any other subject of experience) could possibly have been born and lived in a different human body.

Since conceivability implies metaphysical possibility, and since what is necessary must be the case in every possible world, a subject's relationship to a particular human being is contingent rather than necessary. Further, a subject is ontologically distinguishable from the psycho-physical unity that is a human being. The latter has a determinate essence, and thus, as actual, is an exemplification of a possible world particular. (Therefore, a human being is "a world constitutive particular.") By contrast, a subject, as contingently related to an actual human being, has no determinate qualities in itself. Thus, it has no essence, nor can it have existence in a possible world. (Therefore, a subject is a "world-receptive particular," or soul.)

There are two central difficulties here. First, it is not evident to me that I could conceivably have been born and lived as a different human being while still remaining the same "I" who is the subject of my experiences. It is not apparent that an empirical subject conceivably can be separated from the phenomenological content of his or her experiences. This is not to deny one could make a Kantian argument for a transcendental "I" underlying all empirical experiences, but a transcendental "I" cannot be the same as an empirical and embodied subject of experience. The problem is: what possibility or set of possibilities ought we to be considering when we try to conceive of being the "I," or subject, of a different human being's life? For recall Göcke posits conceivability as essentially related to possibility.

It might be objected that this line of reasoning is at odds with Göcke's view that a subject of experience has no essence and thus is not conceivable in light of possible worlds. But that objection merely brings the second problem to the surface: how in terms of modal rationalism can either the soul be conceivable or it be demonstrated that the soul is contingently related to a particular human, if the soul is not essentially determinate? Further, if the soul, or subject, is not determinately conceivable, then the second point in Göcke's critique of physicalism loses force because on his own grounds he cannot offer a satisfying alternative account of an actual particular, the existing human being, whose properties entail the existence of a subject.

It is likely that Göcke would respond by pointing to his contention that the soul, as a world-receptive particular is intelligible as a subjective center by means of which the actual world is experienced and possible worlds are conceived (p. 143). Formulated differently, the soul gains determination by means of its relations to the actual and the possible.

Further, Göcke stipulates that subjects can be said to have the being of "subsistence," even if they cannot exist, because they do not have essences that could possibly be exemplified (pp. 139-40). Since, however, the soul is without essence it can neither be identical to nor distinct from a human being; in "positive terms," as Göcke puts it, souls stand in "a relation of indistinction" to human beings (p. 141), "they ontologically oscillate . . . between being a world constitutive particular . . . and . . . purely world receptive particulars" (p. 144, Göcke's italics). Yet how are we to understand this ontological oscillation? How is it metaphysically possible? Is this equivocity truly ontological or a nominal artifact of modal rationalism? Is it not a consequence of the conceptual indeterminacy that must follow from trying to conceive what lacks essence after conceivability has been collapsed into the conception of possible worlds?


In chapter ten Göcke argues the actual world exists contingently because it is possible it could not be. On the basis of the principle of sufficient reason he rejects the view that the contingency of the world could be a brute fact; thus, the world must have a ground of its existence. This ground actualizes the temporal flow in the actual world.

Does the infinity of possible worlds exist necessarily? Göcke contends no, because it is conceivable possible worlds could not be. Interpreting a Buddhist meditation practice, he proposes it is conceivable the soul could subsist without having an actual world to experience or possible worlds to consider. Thus, possible worlds do not exist necessarily. Despite this interpretation of Buddhist practice, I am not convinced a subject could conceivably subsist unrelated to any actual or possible world. I take that possibility to be inconsistent with being a subject of experience. Therefore, I am not persuaded all possible worlds exist contingently. Göcke asserts the infinity of possible worlds can be understood as Being (p. 173). What is the being of the possibility that possible worlds could not exist?

Göcke maintains the soul subsists contingently, because it could possibly cease to subsist. Hence, both soul and possible worlds need to be grounded. By Ockham's razor, soul and possible worlds (including the actual world) must share the same ground; further, this ground must transcend them both. Göcke, as noted before, argues that the totality of empirical reality is comprised of soul, possible worlds, and their ground. Therefore, empirical reality is fundamentally triadic. Yet if the ground of soul and possible worlds must transcend experience and possibility, how can this ground be a component of empirical reality?


In chapter eleven Göcke contends that since the totality of empirical reality is contingent, it needs an explanation for its existence on the basis of an ultimate ground that "exists" necessarily. The ultimate ground must exist necessarily, because it could only fail to be if it were possible for nothing to be. If it were possible for nothing to be, then there would be nothing, because only if nothing existed would nothing be possible. Since, however, the empirical world exists, it is not the case that nothing is possible; therefore, the ultimate ground of the world necessarily exists.

As Göcke concedes in an endnote (p. 226, n. 7) this argument faces the objection it has only established the necessary existence of "being as such," not the identity of this necessary existence with an ultimate ground of the empirical world. Bracketing this objection, Göcke maintains if there is an ultimate ground, then it must be "being as such" and utterly simple (without distinction or exclusion from anything else), yet ontologically inclusive and dense with the archetype of the empirical reality it grounds. Thus, following Meister Eckhart, Göcke reasons the ultimate ground is in a "relation of indistinction" with the empirical order: it is neither identical to nor distinct from the world. Since the "overly determinate" Absolute does not have a distinct essence like actual particulars, it does not exist as they do; rather, "being as such" is in a "dialectic of indistinguishability" with the empirical order. Insofar as it is simple it is indistinguishable from the empirical order, and thus, fully immanent; yet, precisely because it is indistinguishable it fully transcends the being of any entity in the world. Thus, Göcke asserts we cannot properly distinguish the Absolute from the being of empirical reality (p. 182).

I do not find this claim to be entirely convincing. Göcke's appeal to dialectic raises questions parallel to the ones that followed his account of soul: is the dialectic truly metaphysical or a nominal construction that follows from founding reason on the conceivability of particulars? Do we not need a richer explanation of reason (including the nature of dialectic) to account for the conceivability of Göcke's concepts regarding the relationship between the overly determinate Absolute and the determinate particulars constituting empirical reality?