A Theory of Virtue: Excellence in Being for the Good

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Robert Merrihew Adams, A Theory of Virtue: Excellence in Being for the Good, Oxford University Press, 2006, 249pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199207518.

Reviewed by Ben Bradley, Syracuse University


Robert Adams's new book is an important and comprehensive contribution to the study of virtue and to the defense of its existence.  The book is an easy read; Adams skillfully lays out his views and arguments clearly and without jargon.  In Part I he explains his theory of virtue as excellence in being for the good, and argues for its superiority over its rivals, including the views of Hurka, Foot and Driver.  More on this Part below.  In Part II he applies his theory to specific examples of virtues and vices involving attitudes towards oneself and others; he argues, in particular, that altruism is intrinsically good (rather than merely instrumentally good), and that a certain sort of self-love may be virtuous and compatible with altruism.  In Part III (which constitutes fully half the book) he addresses several other important questions about virtue, such as:  Are there any virtues?  Are the virtues separable?  Can virtue be taught?  Here he engages well-known recent psychological work on character and the philosophical literature that work has inspired (e.g. the work of Harman and Doris).  Adams argues persuasively that the existence of virtue is compatible with these studies.  What the experiments show is, among other things, that virtues are modular -- decomposable into separate behavioral modules or "micro-virtues" corresponding to distinct sorts of situations (e.g. physical and moral courage) (Ch. 8) -- and frail -- subject to being overcome by the power of a situation (Ch. 9).  Adams argues that despite their modularity and frailty, virtues are intrinsically excellent.  He argues, against the ancients, that it is possible to have some virtues -- and some degree of comprehensive, overall Virtue -- without having all the virtues (Chs. 10-11).  The book closes with an admittedly brief attempt to show that virtue education is both possible and desirable in a liberal state (Ch. 12).

The centerpiece of Adams's book, naturally, is his theory of virtue, according to which virtue is excellence in being for the good.  To "be for" the good is to be disposed to favor it in "action, desire, emotion or feeling" (p. 17).  Adams is a pluralist about the good; the goods that virtue is for include members of several ontological categories, including states of affairs, people, and beautiful objects (p. 22).  Since one can be for the good for the wrong reasons, virtue requires excellence in being for the good.  For example, one who pursues the good for selfish reasons fails to exemplify excellence in being for the good (p. 23), even if that selfishness leads to good results.  An excellence is intrinsically good, not merely instrumentally good; it is "worthy to be honored, loved, admired, or (in the extreme case) worshiped, for its own sake" (p. 24).  Adams is unambitious about providing guidance about what counts as an excellence; he says his view "does not provide an algorithm for virtue" (p. 26).  Judgments of excellence "must rely to a considerable extent on moral perceptiveness" and are "to some extent intuitionistic" (p. 26).

Adams's view is similar to the view put forward by Thomas Hurka in Virtue, Vice and Value.  Hurka claims that virtues are intrinsically good attitudes towards intrinsic goods.  The primary way in which Hurka's view differs from Adams's is that according to Hurka, how virtuous it is to love a particular good depends on the match between the degree of love and the degree of goodness.  If one good is better than the other, the virtuous person loves it more.  Call this the proportionality thesis.  Adams's view is, essentially, Hurka's view with the proportionality thesis removed.

Adams thinks the proportionality thesis yields unacceptable results.  He gives several arguments (pp. 28-29).  First, he says that it seems virtuous for us to care disproportionately about a small number of people, even though they are not objectively more valuable than anyone else.  Someone who cared equally about everyone's well-being would not care sufficiently about anyone.  Even to try to care equally about everyone would make one a basket case, but if one were to succeed, one would be caring insufficiently about one's loved ones.

Second, Adams says that it sometimes seems vicious to care more about one person's well-being than another's, even if proportionality demands this.  Suppose Jim has two daughters, Terry and Sandy.  Terry has a greater capacity for well-being than Sandy does; given the same resources, Terry could live a life that is twice as good as the best life Sandy could live.  Nevertheless, Jim's desire for Terry to live the best possible life she could live should not be twice as strong as his desire for Sandy to live the best possible life she could live.  The desires should be equally strong.

What Adams takes to be the most fundamental problem for the proportionality view is that it is comparative.  He says that excellence "should be appreciated for what it is, not for what something else isn't" (p. 29).  The point, I think, is that our appreciation of an excellence should flow merely from appreciation of its goodness, not from any comparison between it and some other excellence.  The proportionality criterion seems to require us to keep those comparisons in mind when appreciating an excellence.

Adams concludes that excellence and proportionality come apart.  To be excellent in being for the good sometimes involves proportionality; but sometimes it involves caring more for one thing than another even though they are equally good, and sometimes it involves caring equally for two things even though they are not equally good.  And it should not involve making comparisons between excellences.

I think Adams's arguments fail to kill the proportionality thesis; at least, they fail to show that no version of the proportionality thesis is plausible.  Take the Terry and Sandy case.  Here is an argument that, in fact, Jim should have a stronger desire for Terry to live the best life she can live than for Sandy to live the best life she can live.  Suppose the best life Terry could live would have a value of 2n, and the best life Sandy could live would have a value of n.  All should agree that Jim's desire that Terry live a life with value 2n should be stronger than his desire that Terry live a life with value n.  And all should agree that Jim's desire that Terry live a life with value n should be equal in strength to Jim's desire that Sandy live a life with value n.  But suppose Jim fails to have a stronger desire for Terry to live a life with value 2n than for Sandy to live a life with value n.  Then Jim's desires violate the following plausible principle:  if S desires x and y equally, and S desires z more than x, then, if S is rational, S desires z more than y.  If someone desired x and y equally, desired z more than x, and desired z and y equally, she would be a "money pump," and so, it would seem, could not be fully rational.  This is not to say that there is no way to justify Jim taking an egalitarian attitude concerning the well-being of his children.  For example, if equality is intrinsically good, then Jim might be rational in desiring that his daughters be equally well-off, even if the total amount of well-being would be greater if Terry were better off.  And he might be virtuous to do so.  But this is entirely compatible with the proportionality thesis.

Now consider Adams's first argument, which I think is more problematic for Hurka.  Hurka responds by appealing to "agent-relative" intrinsic value; the well-being of those close to me has more intrinsic value relative to me than that of strangers, so it is more appropriate to care more about those close to me (Hurka 199).  Adams notes that this might make Hurka's view indistinguishable from Adams's (p. 29).  But it is not clear that this response is necessary.  The well-being of each person in the world is very important, and merits a strong pro-attitude.  We are finite creatures with fragile psyches; we cannot direct an appropriately-sized pro-attitude towards each person's well-being.  It would not be impossible for a more powerful being, capable of caring equally and appropriately for everyone.  If there were such a being, and that being cared in the way we humans do -- caring a lot for only a few -- would we not be justified in calling that being vicious?  We humans, however, have to make a choice.  Either we must take a completely egalitarian attitude, caring equally (but insufficiently) about each person's well-being, or we must care much more for some people than for others, thereby caring appropriately for at most a few.  The proportionality thesis could be formulated to be compatible with the latter being more virtuous, even if there is no agent-relative intrinsic value.  The proportionality theorist might conclude that people cannot be fully virtuous, or he might say that a person is fully virtuous if she loves the good to the greatest extent humanly possible.  Neither conclusion seems obviously mistaken.  There may be problems for reconciling proportionality and partiality, but I'm not convinced Adams has demonstrated them.

Adams's third argument can be dealt with in a similar way.  The proportionality thesis need not be formulated in a way that entails that we should be making comparisons between goods.  If I am fully appreciating a good G1, and I notice that I am failing to appreciate some other good G2, but I can't fully appreciate both, I need not curb my enthusiasm for G1 to satisfy proportionality.  That is, the proportionality thesis need not be comparative in the way Adams finds problematic (though Hurka's version seems to be).  The appropriateness of my attitude toward a good might depend solely on the value of that good, rather than on a comparison between its intensity and the intensity of appreciation of other goods.

I think Hurka's view has one major advantage over Adams's.  Adams is content to say that excellence is a messy business.  He offers no general principles that determine whether one way of being for the good is more excellent than another.  Perhaps he is right to think that no such principle will be plausible, and that it must be decided on a case-by-case basis whether a given trait is an excellence.  But in that case, what we have is not so much a theory of excellence as a list of excellences.  A view like Adams's should be held only as a last resort, once theorizing has failed.

Adams is of course aware of this criticism.  His response to Hurka's complaint (directed at Slote) of "abandoning explanation" by simply making a list of virtues is to note that Hurka himself merely makes a list of intrinsic goods -- pleasure, knowledge, and achievement -- and defines virtue by appeal to attitudes towards those goods (p. 30).  At best, this merely gets Hurka and Adams into the same boat, without showing that the boat floats.  But as Adams himself notes, Hurka is explicit about the fact that his list is a dummy list, intended to serve as a placeholder in the service of providing a theory of virtue, not as a substitute for serious axiological investigation (Hurka 12).  Adams is pessimistic about the possibility that axiological investigation could result in a plausible and unifying theory of intrinsic value, but offers no arguments here.

Adams has an independent defense of his refusal to provide a unifying explanation of excellence:

I do not think that relying on many diverse judgments of excellence or admirableness that cannot be reduced to a single principle amounts to abandoning explanation as such… .  One's search for explanation might start with a question of the form, 'X seems excellent, but why?'  The initial answer might have the form, 'Because X has characteristics A, B, and C, which are excellent.'  This naturally suggests the question 'Why are A, B, and C excellent?' or 'What's excellent about them?'  And reflection on those questions might turn up quite different grounds of excellence for A, B, and C.  (p. 31)

Given the current popularity of pluralisms of various sorts in ethics, I suspect many readers will find Adams's story here unobjectionable.  I, for one, do not.  If someone were to explain why A is an excellence by appealing to F, and why B is an excellence by appealing to G, but fail to show any interesting unifying connection between F and G, I would not feel that I had been provided an explanation of why A and B are both excellences.  If this were the best explanation available, I would not find the concept of excellence to be of much interest; it would be a gruesome, disjunctive, "Frankenstein" concept unsuitable for use in moral theorizing (though of course its component concepts might be useful individually).  Adams may be right to say that "the process just described agrees well with the structure of traditional thinking about virtue" (p. 31).  If so, I think the traditional thinking about virtue is misguided.  We should not settle for this sort of "explanation," whether in the theory of virtue or the theory of value.

My critical remarks here should not be taken to be a judgment on the book as a whole.  Despite my (likely idiosyncratic) misgivings, and my desire for a more ambitious theory, A Theory of Virtue is well worth reading.  I should mention, for the curious, that this book is unlike Finite and Infinite Goods in that Adams's theory, and his arguments, are wholly detachable from his theological views ('God' makes an appearance, but primarily in parentheses).  Adams's criticisms of opposing theories of virtue are, in general, crisp and cogent.  His discussion of the relevance of situationist psychology to moral theory is thorough and convincing.  For these reasons, and because of the wide range of topics covered, reading Adams's book would be an excellent way for anyone to get up to speed on the current state of virtue theory.  It would make an outstanding text for a graduate seminar on virtue.[1]


Adams, Robert Merrihew.  (1999)  Finite and Infinite Goods:  A Framework for Ethics.  New York:  Oxford University Press.

Doris, John.  (2002)  Lack of Character:  Personality and Moral Behavior.  Cambridge:  Cambridge University Press.

Driver, Julia.  (2001)  Uneasy Virtue.  Cambridge:  Cambridge University Press.

Foot, Philippa.  (2000)  Natural Goodness.  Oxford:  Clarendon Press.

Harman, Gilbert.  (1999)  "Moral Philosophy Meets Social Psychology:  Virtue Ethics and the Fundamental Attribution Error."  Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 99: 315-331.

Hurka, Thomas. (2000)  Virtue, Vice and Value.  New York:  Oxford University Press.

Slote, Michael.  (1992)  From Morality to Virtue.  Oxford:  Oxford University Press.


[1]  Thanks to Jeremy Dickinson and Tom Hurka for helpful discussion.