A Thing of This World: A History of Continental Anti-Realism

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Lee Braver, A Thing of This World: A History of Continental Anti-Realism, Northwestern UP, 2007, 590pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780810123809.

Reviewed by C. G. Prado, Queen's University



This impressive book is characterized by three special virtues: first, it presents difficult philosophical ideas and developments clearly; second, it manifests an unusual and admirable facility with both analytic and continental positions and methodologies; and third, it boasts an extraordinary level of scholarship. My strongest endorsement of Braver’s book is that I dearly wish I’d had it two decades ago.

A Thing of This World is carefully structured, both in terms of Braver’s discussion of developments and in his handling of operant ideas and positions. While the substantial structure is clear enough from the Contents page and the Introduction, the basics of the working structure need to be appreciated to insure productive reading. Braver provides a section he labels “Guide to Matrices” at the beginning of the book, in which he articulates twelve fundamental realist and anti-realist theses as well as five other propositions basic to discussion of the philosophers he considers. For example, “R1” is Putnam’s thesis that “the world consists of some fixed totality of mind-independent objects,” and “A1” is Hegel’s thesis that “consciousness will arrive at a point at which it gets rid of its semblance of being burdened with something alien” (xix-xx). Again, a basic proposition is the “”SpellE">Heideggerian paradigm" or “Historical Phenomenological Ontology,” namely, the view that “There is ”GramE">Being only in this or that historical character" (xx). Braver then proceeds in a manner reminiscent of Spinoza, referring back to individual matrix theses and propositions almost entirely as “R3” or “A5” and with initials like “HPO.” Proceeding in this manner facilitates his exposition, but it imposes on readers the need often to refer back to the list. Additionally, Braver uses initials to refer to no fewer than 128 works by the nine major authors he discusses, requiring frequent checks of the abbreviations list provided (xiii-xviii).

I mention all of this to preempt rather than to make complaints. If Braver didn’t avail himself of these devices, the book would have been considerably longer than its 600-some pages. Moreover, the book is a comprehensive review of complex developments over a significant period of time, so Braver’s devices are appropriate and their use justified even though they sometimes interfere with the narrative flow and introduce minor inconveniences.

The Introduction begins with a comparison of the contemporary split between analytic and continental philosophy and the split between rationalism and empiricism at the end of the eighteenth century, a split that culminated in rationalist metaphysical excess and empiricist epistemological bankruptcy. Braver maintains that the ground for reconciliation of analytic and continental philosophy is “the very idea that forms the core of the Critique of Pure Reason and the linchpin of its rationalist-empiricist synthesis” and this is “the idea that the mind actively organizes experience” (5).

This is where Braver’s originality shows itself, and also where things begin to get complicated for readers who don’t approach the book with an open mind. Braver goes on to say that the mind’s organizing activity is seen as entailing anti-realism by analytic philosophers and has been extensively discussed by such notables as Davidson, Dummett, Goodman, Putnam, Quine, and Wittgenstein. Given Kant’s influence on continental thought, the mind’s organizing activity is also pivotal for continental philosophers. Braver’s idea is that if the two traditions’ different vocabularies are properly understood and correlated by members of each, we will be able to “identify Kant’s idea as seminal for both camps” and thereby have a basis for “informed dialogue and debate” (5).

My first reaction to Braver’s proposal was to think that differences in application of Kant’s idea by analytic and continental philosophers go beyond diverse vocabularies, with the latter taking anti-realism ontologically much further than a Putnam or Quine who mainly try to accommodate the reality of the mind’s experience-organizing role without drawing skeptical, much less irrealist, ontological conclusions. However, recalling my own efforts to show that Foucault is a “tacit realist,” I realized that my reading of Heidegger or Derrida could well be distorted regarding ontological claims and implications by my failure to appreciate vocabulary differences.

Braver’s first chapter after the Introduction is given over to the nature of realism. He articulates the six realist matrix propositions, the first being Putnam’s about the world consisting of mind-independent objects and the second being that truth involves correspondence between words or thoughts and external things (14-15). This is the chapter in which Braver lays out the basic position that contrasts with continental anti-realism. In the process he makes a statement that struck me; while discussing the way in which background and education dispose one to accept certain ideas more readily than others, Braver remarks that “Common sense is largely a matter of the ideas one is used to,” which speaks directly to my reading of his exposition of Heidegger and Derrida (29). The content of this chapter poses no problems for readers with an analytic background and demonstrates Braver’s understanding and appreciation of one side of the philosophical chasm he is trying to bridge.

Chapter Two, “Kant’s Revolution,” is the first of three in Part One. In it Braver offers an impressively clear and solidly supported account of Kant’s making “the phenomenal world mind-dependent” and his changing of “the passive substantial knower to an active organizer of experience” (57). The first anti-realist matrix-propositions are referenced in connection with Kant’s claim that rather than being so many givens, “objects, as appearances, conform to our mode of representation” (33). Braver stresses how fundamentally Kant’s view “alters the conception of knowledge and the role the subject plays in knowing” (35). The point is to articulate clearly the truly revolutionary nature of Kant’s vision to prepare the way for what follows regarding Hegel and Nietzsche’s responses to the idea of the noumenal and how “the difference between [being] nothing to us and nothing at all becomes hard to pin down” (41). The chapter also includes perceptive discussion of two ideas that prove crucial in later discussion: correspondence and the reality of the self.

Prior to the second chapter of Part One, on Hegel, Braver’s exposition is readily accessible to readers having either an analytic or continental background and related predilections. Discussion of Hegel is where what I’ll call “canonical impatience” may pose problems. That this is likely is not Braver’s fault; his exposition of Hegel is clear, and while the chapter runs some 54 pages, the discussion is as concise as is compatible with responsible exposition. Problems center on abandonment of the noumenal and multiplicity of conceptual schemes. Braver sums up by saying that

Hegel’s greatest contributions to continental anti-realism are the introduction of historical change … into the self with the concomitant plurality into conceptual schemes and reality … and the complete dismissal of noumena (112-113).

He adds that Hegel “rigorously follows out the implications … to reach Objective Idealism, which eliminates the distinction between an objective given and our subjective projection” (113).

The problem is why an acknowledged conceptual instability in Kant’s work regarding postulation of the noumenal has to be resolved in favor of our undoubtedly limited conceptual ability. It seems to be philosophical egocentricity to conclude that because we can’t really make much sense of extra-conceptual, inaccessible noumena we must conclude that historical phenomena are all there is. Physics, for instance, would have long since become impossible if it could not postulate directly inaccessible causes of phenomena. What would a Hegelian physicist do with string theory? I make this point to indicate how Braver’s faith in better understanding of mutual vocabularies might not be enough to ground productive interaction between most analytic and continental philosophers.

The chapter on Nietzsche aims to demonstrate that “Nietzsche is not free of the Kantian paradigm” (160). The exposition is again first-rate. Braver describes “Step Six Physics” to establish that Nietzsche doesn’t successfully rid himself of something beyond the purely phenomenal. Braver concedes that “Many commentators … believe that Nietzsche avoids the vestiges of realism I have saddled him with,” appealing to Rorty regarding the conceptual difficulty of avoiding implications that mind “shapes facts out of indeterminate goo” (151). There could be no question of omitting Nietzsche in a history of continental anti-realism, but the chapter left me feeling that it is somewhat marginal. This is likely my own fault because of my experience of hearing and reading Nietzsche interpreted in so many ways that no one interpretation ever seems totally convincing. In any case, the chapter on Nietzsche closes Part One; the next chapter, “Transition,” is on the early Heidegger.

Braver’s two chapters on Heidegger - one 90 pages, the other 84 - are admirably clear and should make Heidegger more accessible or at least intriguing to analytic philosophers. Central to the first of the two chapters is explication and criticism of how realists’ “exclusive focus on presence-at-hand as the sole mode of Being” both distorts our understanding of existence and precludes understanding truth as anything but correspondence to the disposition of things in the world (165, 168). Early in his discussion of realism Braver offers a succinct statement regarding Heidegger’s understanding of Being, saying that

Being and Time outlines three modes of Being . . . : readiness-to-hand … , presence-at-hand … , and existence. Equipment, objects or things, and Dasein are then, respectively, the entities that are [exist] in these different ways (165).

Against this, realism limits existence to only one sort of Being: presence-at-hand or how the world’s physical furniture exists, and in this way “profoundly distorts our daily lives” (165). What makes the early Heidegger’s work transitory is that while he “radically redefines both subject and phenomena, there is a strong continuity with Kant’s thought, as he himself recognizes” (176). The Heidegger of Being and Time is still working with the Kantian paradigm, but the work is transitory because it paves the way for the Heideggerian paradigm.

Braver’s first chapter on Heidegger, well supplied with numerous substantial quotations, begins his most concentrated attempt to establish that identifying the Kantian paradigm as “seminal for both camps” will provide a ground for “informed dialogue and debate” among analytic and continental philosophers (5). Two key aspects are Braver’s lucid restatements and explanations of Heidegger’s remarks, and his criticism of Davidson’s preclusive treatment of conceptual schemes (228-50). The criticism is necessary because the Hegel-Nietzsche-Heidegger progression depends on the at least potential proliferation of conceptual schemes that result from rejecting the idea of a noumenal world. Personally, I was unconvinced by the criticism of Davidson, and my siding with realists like Searle remained unaffected, but Braver’s is a most interesting discussion and often striking, as when he compares passages from Heidegger and Davidson. The upshot of the chapter basically is the point Braver makes early on: “without noumena, the experienced realm that is affected by ”SpellE">Dasein is reality itself; hence our [conceptualizing, organizing] effects on it are not distortive but constitutive" (176). The “meaning of the Being of beings” for Heidegger, therefore, “is ultimately whatever is involved in becoming present to ”SpellE">Dasein" (184). Nonetheless, this is the early Heidegger, the Heidegger still caught in the Kantian paradigm and held back by “his commitment to an ”SpellE">ahistorical permanent structure of the self" (253).

The second chapter on Heidegger, “The Great Turning Around,” begins with a summation:

For the thinkers of the Kantian Paradigm … Active Knower’s faculties partially constitute … dependent reality by either organizing it with space, time, and the categories (Kant), volatilizing historical movement (Hegel), congealing chaotic flux (Nietzsche), or temporalizing into the forms of engaged instrumentality or disengaged inertness (early Heidegger) (257).

According to Braver, the later Heidegger’s abandonment of truth as correspondence in favor of aletheia or “”SpellE">unconcealment" enables him to also abandon realism of the subject, and so to leave the Kantian paradigm behind in establishing the Heideggerian paradigm: “In his later work, Heidegger places everything within history; there is nothing essential and self-same that transcends historical change.” There is no Cartesian ego, no Kantian self; "for anyone who wishes to escape the subject-centered philosophy of the Kantian Paradigm, later Heidegger is the unavoidable thinker" (260). This is how Heidegger established “the first genuinely non-Kantian position in the continental tradition” and why the later Heidegger is of such great importance to the development of continental thought (253). For Braver, Heidegger’s abandonment of truth as some sort of correspondence, and of the underlying picture of thought/assertion relating to objective states-of-affairs, is “a new beginning in the history of Western thought” (259). He goes on to say that this is why “recent continental philosophy can appear so strange: it operates outside of assumptions that have widely been considered necessary for all discourse,” and aptly refers to Searle as an example of philosophers who resist the Heideggerian shift (260).

Foucault certainly escapes the Kantian paradigm; for him the self, the subject, is constructed: a product of practices and power-relations. Braver’s seventh chapter, on Foucault, is again first-rate with respect to exposition. It is with respect to interpretation that my reservations increase. Though Foucault himself may have described Heidegger as the essential philosopher for him, Braver’s efforts to show that Foucault “is best read as a disciple of Heidegger” left me unconvinced (427). This is especially true when Braver discusses a “serious problem” Foucault faces regarding inconsistency between his own goal to provoke change regarding subjectivity and his alleged “allegiance to the ”SpellE">Heideggerian Paradigm’s Historical Phenomenological Ontology" (421). In my view, Foucault’s rejection of “deep” abstractions and philosophizing about them precludes any such allegiance. Heidegger inspired and to a great extent enabled Foucault’s thought; that did not make Foucault a disciple of Heidegger. I’m almost out of room, so will gratefully forgo commenting on Braver’s last substantive chapter, the one on Derrida. I’m sure the exposition is as good as in previous chapters, but I don’t know Derrida well enough to say more.

Braver’s Conclusion illustrates his fairness and facility with both continental and analytic positions: he considers some of the important differences between analytic and continental philosophy. In the end, does Braver make his case that appreciation of the role of the Kantian paradigm and clarification of vocabulary will provide common ground for productive interchange between analytic and continental philosophers? What he does do is succeed remarkably well at making the continental progression from Hegel through Derrida clear and intriguing to analytic philosophers. To a lesser extent, in rehearsing the elements of the progression he makes analytic philosophy clear and accessible to continental philosophers. But two major factors impair the sought rapport. One is that however well explained, anti-realism won’t wash with most analytic thinkers. The idea of a noumenal, an inaccessible-as-is, reality is admittedly problematic, but so is that of light as both waves and particles. The other is a point Rorty makes, which Braver himself quotes in a note — namely, that it’s pointless to try to bridge the analytic/continental split because it’s not a matter of the two sides addressing the same problems with different methods but rather that they address different problems (515; Rorty, The Consequences of Pragmatism, 225-26).