A Thomistic Tapestry: Essays in Memory of Eienne Gilson

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Redpath, Peter A. (ed.), A Thomistic Tapestry: Essays in Memory of Eienne Gilson, Rodopi, 2003, 263pp, $62.00 (pbk), ISBN 904200875X.

Reviewed by Denis Bradley , Georgetown University


This memorial volume, the first in a projected series honoring the person and the scholarship, and promoting the philosophical doctrines of the late and great Étienne Gilson (b. 6/3/1884 in Paris; d. 9/19/1978 in Auxerre) is a miscellany of eleven articles, with seven pages of charming photographs, written by his former students, disciples, and admirers. This first volume is dedicated to another onetime Gilson student, subsequently a colleague at the Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies in Toronto, the Rev. Armand A. Maurer, C.S.B., in appreciation of “his masterful application of the Gilsonian method.” The eleven articles raise appropriately Gilsonian themes: (1) “The Enlightening Gloss: Gilson and the History of Philosophy” (Jorge J. E. Gracia); (2) “The Practical Nature of Philosophy” (Richard Geraghty); (3) “Philosophy's Non-Systematic Nature” (Peter A. Redpath); (4) “The Beauty of Wisdom” (Robert A. Delfino); (5) “Étienne Gilson and the San Francisco Conference” (Desmond J. FitzGerald); (6) “Maritain's Reply to Gilson's Rejection of Critical Realism” (Raymond Dennehy); (7) “On the Nature of Being and Division of the Speculative Sciences” (Joseph J. Califano); (8) “Gilson and Maritain: Battle Over the Beautiful” (Francesca Murphy); (9) “Gilson and Gouhier: Approaches to Malebranche” (Richard J. Fafara); (10) “Poinsot, Pierce, and Pegis: Knowing as a Way of Being” (James Maroosis); (11) “Possessed of Both a Reason and a Revelation” (James V. Schall).

Given the terms of the book's dedication, the first question to ask is: What is the “Gilsonian method”? Robert Delfino's article summarizes Maurer's 1983 book, About Beauty: A Thomistic Interpretation. But this book is perhaps not the best instance of Maurer applying the “Gilsonian method” of historical scholarship; in it, Maurer attempts a metaphysical synthesis and Thomistic prolongation rather than the uncovering and interpretation of the historical sources of Aquinas's scattered remarks about beauty: beauty is a transcendental property of being, differing from being only in notion; it is a pleasing intellectual vision of the claritas, consonantia, integritas “radiating” from a thing's form (cf. ST, I, q. 5, a. 4, ad 1). In The Arts of the Beautiful, Gilson, using a neologism incorporating the Greek term kalos (beauty), called this kind of metaphysics of transcendental beauty a “calology,” which he then carefully distinguished both from “aesthetics,” the theory of how artistic beauty is perceived, and the “philosophy of art,” “the theory of how works of art are made.” The distinctions were controversial. Gilson and Maritain, although presumably they agreed about the metaphysical elements of Aquinas's “calology,” had lengthy, disputatious, and rather personally embittered exchanges, so Francesca Murphy recounts, about the possibility and manner of distinguishing the other two philosophical theories about art.

Jorge Gracia, who himself has written astutely about the variant philosophical uses of the history of philosophy, irenically labels Gilson's historical method “the enlightening gloss.” According to Gracia, Gilson's primary purpose was to understand the text of an historical author by understanding the “controversies, issues and views common when it was produced” (p. 2). Typically, Gilson glosses his focal texts by (1) using a battery of philosophical concepts—that are not always sufficiently explained, so Gracia judges—to interpret them; (2) having his own explicit philosophical criterion by which to evaluate them; (3) simplifying or reducing textual and conceptual complexities to the main philosophical issue raised in the focal text(s). In short, Gilson's enlightening gloss is “an explanatory paraphrase” of the sort that so-called contemporary “analytic Thomists,” who are fond of minute logical reconstructions of Aquinas's arguments, largely eschew. Gracia contends, correctly, that Gilson narrated the history of philosophy as one long praeparatio for and one long declinatio from Aquinas: in particular, from Aquinas's “existentialism”—linguistically marked by the Latin infinitive of the verb “to be”—the metaphysics of esse. Gilson famously opined that Aquinas, inspired by what the saint himself called (SCG, I, c. 22; Pera, 2: 33a, n. 211) “the sublime truth” that God revealed to Moses, recorded in Exodus, 3.13 (“Ego sum qui sum,” in the Latin translation familiar to Aquinas), came to a historically unique understanding of the divine name that, Gilson held, was the keystone of Thomistic metaphysics: the divine essence is identical with ipsum esse subsistens, and that the finite actus essendi which participates the divine esse is the foundational actuality of all created natures.

Gracia does not mention, however, that Gilson's narrative alleging the revealed source and the historical uniqueness of the Thomistic metaphysical insight has been plausibly challenged by Hadot and other scholars, who trace the Thomistic ipsum esse subsistens doctrine through the medieval neo-Platonist tradition—mediated to Aquinas by Pseudo-Dionysius, Boethius, and Proclus—back to an anonymous commentary (probably by Porphyry) on Plato's Parmenides. For the anonymous commentator, the first principle is not, in typical neo-Platonist fashion, “beyond being” but is pure activity (auto to enérgein) whose nature is designated by the infinitive auto to eînai. Hadot's alternative account raises many questions, which have been put in the form of a direct challenge by Wayne Hankey, about the soundness of Gilson's historical views. If Hadot and Hankey are correct, Gilson was wrong about the historical uniqueness and biblical source of Aquinas's esse metaphysics.

So too, questions about how historical method should be used and what it reveals in philosophy—Is the history of philosophy focused on the chains of essentially or necessarily connected ideas or on contingent and self-contained, radically personalized insights?—underlie the rather spun-out but worthwhile article that Richard Fafara devotes to the relationship between Gilson and his doctoral student Henri Gouhier (1898-1994). Gouhier's student thesis (La pensée religieuse de Descartes), the product of a seminar with Gilson, was published and awarded a prize by the Academie française in 1924. In his thesis, Gouhier rejected any temporally fixed or abstractly global portrait of Descartes's thought; instead, he presented Cartesian philosophy biographically as a succession of recastings which reinvented for diverse audiences Descartes's earliest themes. Gilson, while remaining unconvinced by some of Gouhier's particular claims (especially Descartes's alleged affinities with Thomism rather than, as scholarly convention held, the Augustinianism of the seventeenth century French Oratory), nonetheless, praised his student's method as Aristotelian as well as properly historical: Gouhier's interpretative focus, biographical rather than systematic, moves from Descartes's concrete actions to cautious speculations about Descartes's (for Gilson irretrievably) hidden motives. Though Gouhier became a life-long friend and eminent colleague, the erstwhile student never agreed with his former maître about the nature and end of historical method. Their disagreements conspicuously surfaced in their respective interpretations of Malebranche.

For Gilson, Malebranche was not just, in some vague sense, a “religious philosopher” but an Augustinian, who, like his thirteenth century predecessors (especially Bonaventure), regarded Aristotle as pagan and Aristotelian scholasticism as an idolatry that concedes far too much ontological density to the creature. Moreover, Gilson maintained that it was the Aristotelian notion of nature as sufficient unto itself that allowed Aquinas to distinguish with unequaled precision “the respective domains of the supernatural and the natural, and of theology and philosophy” (p. 114). Malebranche's occasionalism, with its attendant denial of the reality and efficacy of secondary causes, is the antithesis of St. Thomas's created world which is robustly and intrinsically causal. Malebranche's occasionalism indicates that a philosophy's Christian inspiration is no guarantee of its being a sound philosophy. In Gilson's synthetic view of the history of philosophy, bad ideas, which like all ideas capture intelligible universals, connect in a constellation of essential relations and have their own impersonal consequences that devolve independently of their original context and their author's intentions. In his two doctoral theses, brilliantly defended in 1926 before an admiring audience of eminent academics, Gouhier took account of Gilson's notion of Christian philosophy and the Augustinianism of Malebranche; he located the center of Malebranche's philosophy in our union with a God whose power and glory must be exalted in preference to the putative autonomy of the creature. Yet, Gouhier sustained a phenomenological, rather than a conceptual or systematizing, approach that tries to remain internal to the thought which it describes: accordingly, Malebranche's philosophical vision arises from and articulates a world of Christian experience to be lived and understood only from within itself. Thus Gouhier's historical method permits the historian, who would remain really in contact with Malebranche's own world, no access to an external reference point from which to criticize it. Evidently, this is not how Gilson practiced “the” historical method. Forty years later, in a letter to Gouhier (9 June 1966), Gilson refers disapprovingly to Gouhier's “radical historical contingentism”, which ignores the metaphysical necessities inherent in philosophical thinking. History, as narrative, does bear on the individual and the contingent particular but philosophy, as science, bears on the universal and the essential. The philosophical historian can link the thoughts of philosophers, if they derive from a common principle, and thereby reveal the inevitability of those conceptual chains. With remarkable éclat, Gilson himself did just that in The Unity of Philosophical Experience.

As one might expect from disciples moving still in the ambit of their master, almost every article in this book rehearses rather than criticizes or deconstructs Gilson's historical and philosophical views. It is not surprising, then, that (Dennehy excepted) Maritain remains for most of them, as he was for Gilson, the great alternative Thomist. So, Richard Geraghty does again what he did in his published doctoral thesis; he takes issue with Maritain's notion of moral philosophy (influenced by John of St. Thomas) as “a speculatively practical science” needing to be supplemented by a “practically practical science” (p. 15). Geraghty convincingly argues that Aquinas's distinction of the speculative and practical sciences is disjunctive; it eliminates the middle ground on which Maritain seeks to position ethics. The goal of ethics as a practical science is determining, choosing, and effecting the right deed to be done. Aristotelian ethics in making that practical determination draws on but does not get bogged down in metaphysics; rather, it takes as its own proper starting point (NE, I, 4, 1095b16-22) “the well-habituated person as the highest standard of his culture” (p. 16). Such a man will already know that honor is better than pleasure, and virtue better than honor. He needs only to be instructed through the theoretical demonstrations of the moral philosopher that the intellectual virtue of contemplation is the highest component of happiness. More controversial and less convincing are Geraghty's brief remarks (pp. 26-27) on how Aquinas the “moral theologian” differs from Aquinas the “moral philosopher”—which can only mean Aquinas the commentator on Aristotle's ethics. In that capacity, Aquinas quietly attempts to shore up Aristotle's well-habituated man by insinuating into his exegesis some hint of the medieval Christian doctrine of synderesis, the innate knowledge of universal principles of practical reason that license quasi-immediate inferences to the inviolable moral precepts of the Decalogue. [Cf. III Sent., d. 33, q. 2,a. 4, sol. 4 (Moos, 3: 1066, n. 242); SLE, II, 4, 1105b5, 101-6; V, 12, 1134b19, 49-57; VI, 11, 1144b1, 30-33.] Since Aquinas grounds these self-evident “natural law” principles “onto-theologically” (in the human mind they participate the divine law in God's mind), it is highly doubtful that Aquinas held that “two irreducible ways exist to consider human actions”—”from the viewpoint of faith in the word of God and the viewpoint of the reason of the good and experienced person” (p. 26; italics my emphasis).

As one might also suspect, there are several potent doses of anti-modernisme administered in this inaugural volume. James Schall warns that neither theology nor philosophy can declare “its own absolute autonomy” (p. 178). The warning is hitched to current events: “Current worldwide political turmoil” (p. 179), especially as it arises from conflicts between secular and Islamic cultures, exposes (Leo Strauss notwithstanding) the impossibility of “two [unrelated] truths,” that is, it exposes the need to harmonize without eliminating either reason or revelation. Gilson sought to harmonize them using the reasoning of Aquinas. Aquinas showed that philosophy cannot be identified even with “The Philosopher,” Aristotle, and that faith is not contrary to sound philosophy, thereby freeing reason and protecting revelation: in other words, Aquinas showed that Aristotle's arguments leading to conclusions contra articulos fidei are non-demonstrative and that there are cogent rational proofs for the praembula fidei. Thus reason, without negating itself, leaves an opening wherein one—moved by divine grace—may rationally accept transcendent or super-rational revealed truths. In no way, then, does Gilson propose, contrary to what Murphy erroneously states, that we can only begin with “the act of blind faith in the invisible God” (p. 103). It is the modern rejection of Aristotle, which was undertaken as the necessary propaedeutic for modern science, that has led to a philosophical reason severely diminished by “relativism and skepticism” (p. 180) and a correlative religious fideism. For his part, Gilson attempted to reinvigorate modern philosophical reason “by restoring revelation to its proper content and role” (p. 182). The restorative revelation in question is—and Schall unhesitatingly affirms that it can only be—Christian: for Schall, the West's struggle with an ideological Islam appealing to the arbitrary (that is, non-rational) will of Allah, is, first of all, a struggle within Islam about whether its own economic and political marginalization must be attributed to untrue religious beliefs and faulty intellectual foundations.

The editor of this volume, Peter Redpath, is convinced, and doubtless not he alone among its authors, that Gilson cleared the historical and doctrinal path, by exposing modern philosophy as an epistemological detour leading to an idealist cul-de-sac, back to the enduring truths of Thomistic “realism.” Redpath celebrates the significance of Maurer's essay, “The Unity of a Science: St. Thomas and the Nominalists,” which was written for the septicentennial celebration of St. Thomas's death. In this essay, Maurer traces Descartes's dream of a systematic science of clear and distinct ideas (so important for modern conceptions of science) to its historical antecedents in the late medieval nominalists, notably William of Ockham, who rejected Aquinas's doctrine that a science is unified in reference to its abstracted formal object. Similarly, Joseph Califano singles out for praise Maurer's lucid English translation and helpful annotation of Aquinas's Commentary on the de Trinitate of Boethius: the fifth and sixth question of this commentary explicitly treat the division of the three theoretical sciences (physics, mathematics, and metaphysics) by detailing the three kinds of abstraction from matter that the intellect can effect. The nominalists, after eliminating universal intelligible natures (and thus abstracted formal objects), had to find a new ground for the unity of a science. Leibniz, commenting on the seventeenth century nominalist, the philosopher Mario Nizolius, praises the medieval nominalists as “most in harmony with the spirit of modern philosophy” (quoted Redpath, p. 31). For this very reason, however, Redpath would be forced to brand, eagerly it seems, modern philosophy as well as its late medieval antecedent “a sophistry” (p. 34).

The way back to pre-modern epistemic certitudes, however, may not be so straight as Redpath hopes, even for convinced Thomists: Raymond Dennehy, rehearses—syncretizing their positions rather than clearly resolving—the exact issue between Maritain and Gilson. How should an “authentic” Thomistic realism be grounded: immediately or critically? Everything depends on how the bugbear, “critique of knowledge,” is defined. The issue inflamed neo-Thomists for almost a hundred years. Dennehy, a Maritainian partisan despite his conciliatory intent, continues to think that Thomistic realism, standing before the bottomless “epistemological trench” of modern scepticism, somehow requires and permits both an immediate and a critical grounding, thereby apparently—or coming very close to—conceding the need and the possibility of exactly what Gilson, ever the vigilant anti-Cartesian, never ceased to deny: a reflexive, second order, inferentially constructed bridge to the extra-mental world of naturally knowable things. This is not to deny that Thomists need a cognitive theory (explaining how we know the extra-mental world); it is to say that it should not be conflated with critique (essaying to demonstrate the conclusion that we do know the world). While perhaps not conflating them, Maritain—with Dennehy in tow—seems to think that the former is somehow a suitable and necessary stand-in for the latter. (For a vastly more developed and sustainable version of the latter position, which really does sublate the now rather faded neo-Thomist controversy, one can recommend total immersion in Lonergan.)

In any case, Gilson surely would never have agreed—however intense Maritain's Bergsonian inspired anxieties—that his brand of “dogmatic” realism entailed or was implicated in a dangerous “relying on intuition cut free from rationality” (p. 78): analytically, ens is the first concept that falls under the intellect's act of simple apprehension, but it is the judgment that extra-mental “Being is and non-being is not” that is the first cognitive certitude or principle of knowledge. The critical illusion, Gilson repeated incessantly, is to imagine that one can attain some greater epistemic certitude than what is actually available at the very beginning. Immediate cognitive contact with the extra-mental world is either a self-evident first principle or, as the history of modern philosophy proved to Gilson at least, a radically shaky, impossible to preserve, and, finally, utterly unreachable conclusion. To the very end, Gilson scorned Maritain's whole epistemological anxieties. In 1919, Maritain signed the apodeictic manifesto of the politically right-wing and aesthetically conservative so-called “parti de l'intelligence.” Fifty-five years later, one year after Maritain's death, Gilson wrote acerbically to Armand Maurer that Maritain's youthful “revival of realism,” once so attracted to but then so intemperately denigratory of Bergson's alleged irrationalism, was not, in fact, “the party of being.” It is hard to imagine a greater Gilsonian “put-down.” Francesca Murphy proposes, though I am disinclined to accept it, that it is through his own notion of “a vital, fluid, and energetic act of existence [that] Gilson incorporated the Bergsonian intuition into his metaphysics” (p. 99). On the contrary, Gilson always insisted that we attain the actus essendi only through judgment.

The book—I mean to say with benignity—is an in-house laudation of Gilson: genial, almost wistful in recalling the magnificent scholar, superb teacher, and deeply Christian man. Who could deny—and why would one want to?—that Gilson was an “intellectual giant” who “dwarfed and intimidated many of his contemporaries” (xvii). No mere intellectual giant though: Gilson, in his own life and in the polis, was capable of applying luminous theory to opaque practice; in 1945, he served as a member of the French delegation to the conference writing the charter for the United Nations. Desmond Fitzgerald recalls the droll incident of Gilson speaking Russian to Molotov and his fellow Soviets—slyly, and to their chagrin, only at the very end of the Conference. This profound humanist, then, was a giant in many senses.

Nonetheless, Gilson's intellectual contemporaries are not our contemporaries; ours are no longer so intimidated by the deceased giant. In a published lecture (the twenty-first in “The Étienne Gilson Series), given 3 March 2000 at the Pontifical Institute of Medieval Studies, Marcia Colish provides some details about the “newer maps” of scholasticism that are being drawn, and that decenter Aquinas, who occupied the high point of the “old story-line” of the neo-Thomists, including Gilson. But lest we too quickly assimilate Gilson to other “neo-Thomists,” we might remind Colish that Gilson began his career not as a medievalist but studying Descartes, whose sources he traced back to the Middle Ages. Gilson backed into the Middle Ages and he always read the mediaevals with his eye on his contemporaries as well as the moderns—some have said with an eye too fixed on Heidegger's dubious history of the forgetfulness of being. As I mentioned, Wayne Hankey, drawing on recent French scholarship, has written a series of provocative articles about the neo-Platonist sources of Aquinas's existential metaphysics that purport to show that “Gilson's Thomism is past, being sustainable neither historically nor philosophically” (“Denys and Aquinas: Antimodern cold and postmodern hot,” in Christian Origins: Theology, Rhetoric and Community [London/New York: Routledge, 1998], 139–84; quotation p. 147). Well, I am still confident that Gilson's astonishing historical scholarship, like those of the unsurpassably erudite nineteenth-century German classicists, will remain for a very long time a touchstone for all latter-day medievalists. But it is not, of course, the ne plus ultra. Hankey's provocative judgments do call for some considered response from Gilsonians, who tend to spend too much time rehearsing the jejune neo-Thomist debates of the last century. Doubtless Gilson, if he were still with us, would respond to Hadot and Hankey and to many others: his continuous engagement with contemporary intellectual life is what made him more than just a “historian.”

As for Gilson's own philosophical views, they will have as much vitality and pertinence as the Gilsonians who espouse them. Anton Pegis, another one of Gilson's illustrious students and colleagues, continually urged his fellow Thomists not merely to repeat but to use Aquinas's principles in their own, personally constructed dialogue with contemporary philosophers. Nothing less should be asked of present-day and future Gilsonians, if there be such. To his credit, James Maroosis, in the present volume, makes valiant if somewhat convoluted efforts to find Pierce, Jean Poinsot (John of St. Thomas), and Anton Pegis concurring on the structure of cognitive intentionality: on Maroosis's reading, all affirm that knowledge is the presence of the mind-independent other but known as other solely within the knower—a paradoxical relationship of sign to signified that is trans-subjective or external world-dependent but which allows the world to be interiorly manifested and objectified only within the knower.

Nonetheless, a certain pained desire for le beau temps perdu suffuses the present book. Dare one attribute—yet one more time— this nostalgia to the vicissitudes of Catholic intellectual and cultural life since the Second Vatican Council? No matter: non-Gilsonian “externs,” who as students had intellectually powerful but not quite world-making maîtres and who as academics wear differently calibrated spectacles when looking at and evaluating modern philosophical projects, will doubtless feel less nostalgic and, likely, less convinced that the way forward is the way backward. Yet, it would be a mistake, whether one wants to go backwards or forwards, to ignore Gilson. Undoubtedly, he would have rejected so simple-minded a dichotomy and given historically and philosophically overriding reasons to do so. If for that reason alone, one can happily welcome this inaugural issue of the promised Gilson series.