A Two-Dimensionalist Guide to Conceptual Analysis

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Jens Kipper, A Two-Dimensionalist Guide to Conceptual Analysis, Ontos, 2013, 308pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 978386838141.

Reviewed by D. Gene Witmer, University of Florida


Conceptual analysis has been out of favor in philosophy for at least a few decades now. Still, it has its defenders, and the recent development of two-dimensional semantics has often played a key role in such defenses. Jens Kipper pursues this strategy in an admirably systematic and careful fashion. The result is a valuable resource for both friends and foes of conceptual analysis. It is especially appropriate for use as a structuring text for a graduate seminar on these topics. (I should note, in this connection, that it is presently available as a free e-book in the Ontos Open series.)

The book is divided into eight chapters:

  1. What is conceptual analysis and what is the problem?
  2. Two-dimensionalism and the necessary a posteriori
  3. The challenge from the epistemic arguments
  4. Primary intensions, defining the subject, and communication
  5. Epistemic transparency and epistemic opacity
  6. Scrutability, primary intensions, and conceptual analysis
  7. The trouble with definitions and the aims of conceptual analysis
  8. Concluding remarks

In his introductory remarks, Kipper designates the first three substantial chapters (2, 3 and 4) as those in which he develops and defends the kind of two-dimensionalism he favors, while in the latter three (5, 6, and 7) he explores the relevance of his two-dimensionalism to the project of conceptual analysis. One might quibble with this description, given that one of the main tasks of chapter 6 is to defend the thesis of scrutability, earlier presented as part of the two-dimensionalism in question. Nonetheless, scrutability -- the thesis, roughly put, that "the grasp of a primary intension is supposed to bestow the ability to determine the extension of an expression with respect to any hypothetical scenario a priori" (3) -- is directly relevant to the project of conceptual analysis, so that way of organizing the material is appropriate.

A somewhat surprising aspect of the book is that at no point does Kipper address Quinean concerns about the analytic or conceptual analysis in general. While I am glad the day has passed when philosophers felt obliged to treat Quinean claims as established dogma, Quine's concern that there is no principled way to distinguish between what is crucial to a concept and what is merely collateral information remains an important challenge. I don't take the fact that Kipper doesn't address this to be a substantive flaw; after all, one can only tackle so many issues at a time. But those philosophers especially taken with Quinean arguments should be warned that no attempt is made to address them in A Two-Dimensionalist Guide.

But there is much else that is addressed, of course, and the book is a rich compendium of carefully presented arguments. The overall position Kipper develops is not unfamiliar, but he advances the debate on many fronts by means of his detailed engagement with pertinent objections. I am impressed in particular with his defense of two-dimensionalist treatments of modal error (§2.2), his discussion of semantic deference (§3.1.2), his discussion of incomplete understanding and Burge-style cases and their relevance for conceptual analysis (the appendix to chapter 5), his critical treatment of Frank Jackson's arguments regarding communication and his own more modest alternative theses (§4.2), his account of idealization and its role (§6.2), and his short discussion of analyses of knowledge meant to "illustrate that there are approaches which integrate many lessons from counterexamples to previous analyses, which have already yielded analyses which are (at least in an intuitive sense) more adequate than the standard analysis of knowledge and which are eligible for further development" (289). I can hardly do justice in this space to the several interesting points made in these areas. Instead, I will review the main claims Kipper makes regarding both two-dimensionalism and conceptual analysis and then make some critical comments on a few key topics.

By "conceptual analysis" Kipper generally means the activity of analysis, not the result. More precisely, conceptual analysis is stipulated to include any activity "of trying to gain knowledge -- philosophical or otherwise -- which is based on conceptual competence" (9). The activity need not be based solely on such competence, he tells us; so long as it partly relies on such competence it can count as conceptual analysis. This characterization may be rather more generous than desired, since it arguably includes any inference that turns on one's recognition of an entailment. If I infer that P from my belief that P and Q, my doing so is based, at least in part, on my competence with the concept of conjunction. Kipper's topic is not this wide-ranging, however. The book focuses nearly exclusively on the activity of considering hypothetical scenarios, rendering judgments about those scenarios, and using those verdicts to shape an account of the concepts at issue -- as well as the nature of the entities picked out by those concepts.

What exactly is the two-dimensionalism that Kipper defends? The position ("2Dism" hereafter) is a close kin to that advanced by David Chalmers and Frank Jackson. The central claim is that each linguistic expression is associated with both a primary and a secondary intension, where the former is a function from each centered world wc to an extension reflecting what the expression's extension is on the supposition that wc is the actual world (and treating the expression as if it were uttered at the center of wc) and the latter is a function from each world w to an extension reflecting what the expression's extension in fact is when evaluated at world w. Ultimately, Kipper opts for a view that associates primary intensions not with linguistic expressions but with thoughts; still, the thoughts are picked out as those that are expressed by means of tokens of certain expressions.

The worlds over which these intensions are defined are taken to be all the metaphysically possible worlds, and the 2Dism Kipper defends includes two key theses (22-23):

2D1. A sentence S has a necessary secondary intension iff S is metaphysically necessary.

2D2. A sentence S has a necessary primary intension iff S is a priori.

Given how the intensions are defined, 2D1 is uncontroversial, but 2D2 is contentious. The key contention built into 2D2 is the principle of Metaphysical Plenitude: "For all S, if S is epistemically possible, there is a centered metaphysically possible world that verifies S" (27). As Kipper uses "epistemically possible," epistemic possibility includes anything that is "compatible with everything we can know a priori" (22). We are most apt to think here of examples in which we can conceive of a situation in which S is false, and Metaphysical Plenitude entails that the primary intension of S is, then, possibly false. It should be noted that the principle as stated extends as well to cases in which we cannot conceive of such a situation yet still cannot rule out a priori the falsity of S. It is unclear to me whether this extension of the claim is plausibly supported in the same way that a limited version -- that is, one limited to cases where we can conceive of a situation in which S is false -- is supported. Kipper does not address this question, and his main interest is plainly in that limited range of cases.

A further thesis that is essential to the position Kipper defends is the thesis of scrutability, expressed as follows (and presumably named for the work of Chalmers and Jackson) (31):

(CJ) If a subject possesses a concept and has unimpaired rational processes, then sufficient empirical information about the actual world puts a subject in a position to identify the concept's extension.

The "sufficient empirical information" clause is clarified by appeal to the notion of a canonical description, where a canonical description relative to a concept C is one that (i) does not include a term expressing C itself and (ii) includes only terms that are "epistemically transparent" -- that is, terms for which "their secondary application conditions are a priori accessible" (31). Kipper later introduces two stronger theses: CJ+ generalizes the subject's ability to identify the extension to an ability spanning all possible scenarios, and CJ++ adds the further claim that this ability is an ability to acquire a priori knowledge. He argues that if we accept CJ we have good reason to accept CJ+ and CJ++ as well.

Presumably, CJ is not intended as a completely general thesis, at least with the restrictions on "sufficient empirical information" given above, since surely some concepts will be such that their extensions are not determined by any set of facts that can be expressed without using C itself. Kipper does not spell this out, but some such restriction is manifest in his discussion. This is especially apparent when he turns to defend CJ. His first move in motivating CJ is to argue that Metaphysical Plenitude implies CJ -- or, more precisely, it implies "that everything is a priori scrutable from a canonical description of a scenario which exhaustively specifies the distribution of fundamental properties, if supplemented by a) a clause stating that the description thus given is complete and b) indexical information" (209). Kipper doesn't say just what he means by a "fundamental property", but it seems likely that he is thinking of a fundamental property as any property such that it fails to supervene (with metaphysical necessity) on any family of distinct properties.

So how is 2Dism as here delineated relevant to the project of conceptual analysis? Kipper sees the latter not as the investigation of concepts for their own sake but, as he puts it, an attempt "to gain insight into what is really, i.e., metaphysically, possible or necessary" (26). The links in 2D1 and 2D2 ensure that a priori reflection is relevant to this task. Still, this access is not quite what one would hope for in vindicating conceptual analysis. In actual philosophical practice it is hardly the norm for a thought experiment to proceed on the assumption that the scenario described is actual; rather, we typically think of it as counterfactual in the first place and evaluate it as such. If the concept is transparent, this practice is harmless, but it is unclear how many such concepts there are, and for any that are not, this way of vindicating conceptual analysis will require rethinking the significance of many thought experiments. It may be that most of the cases we consider in philosophy use only epistemically transparent concepts. Kipper provides no reassuring argument that philosophers deal mostly with such transparent concepts, but he persuasively rebuts arguments for thinking that transparency is rare (§5.1) and provides a brief discussion of the value of a priori investigation of concepts that are not in this way transparent (§5.3).

Suppose that the concept C is transparent -- or, perhaps, that we are only interested in its primary intension in the first place. Then just what does the 2Dism here set out ensure by way of the prospects for analysis? As Kipper points out (280), if we include the strongest scrutability thesis CJ++, according to which we can know a priori the extension of a concept for "any given scenario" considered as actual, then it is in principle possible to arrive at a set of necessary and sufficient conditions for the applicability of C according to its primary intension simply by disjoining a series of conditionals: if such and such scenario is actual, then such and such is in C's extension. Of course, this method will be of no use to us if the distribution of C's extension across these different centered worlds is entirely without a pattern, but Kipper suggests that this is generally quite unlikely, so the project of finding some manageable expression of those conditions may be difficult but not hopeless. That the distribution of C's extension is random is indeed implausible, but it is not obvious that we can safely move from "there is a pattern to the extension" to "that pattern is discernible in some canonical vocabulary." Perhaps the pattern in question can only be captured using concepts whose secondary intensions are not a priori accessible. One might try to argue that any pattern to which we are appropriately responsive must be one that can be captured in such a canonical vocabulary -- but it seems to me unduly optimistic to think such an argument is to be had.

I turn now to a few critical remarks. The first concerns Kipper's treatment of intersubjective variation in the primary intensions associated with a term.

A straightforward two-dimensionalist theory might hold that for each public language term T, there is a determinate primary intension I such that anyone competent with T associates I with T. Such a view is easy to dismiss if one imagines that the primary intensions must be capturable in descriptions of the sort that Kripke famously discussed.  The view is somewhat more plausible when we allow those intensions to be sensitive to an intention to defer, so that, for example, my use of T may be intended to refer to whatever T referred to when earlier used by others. Even given this device, it is hard to maintain that all speakers associate the same intension with the same term. Kipper makes this especially clear in his discussion of communication and his critique of the idea that communication involves the transfer of primary intensions (see especially §4.2.1). Instead, as mentioned briefly above, on Kipper's view it is not linguistic expressions (neither types nor tokens of such) that are associated with primary intensions; the intensions are properly assigned to thoughts (§3.2).

Still, this forces on us a dilemma: if speakers of the same language associate different primary intensions with a common term, either they have different concepts or concepts do not determine primary intensions. Either way seems rather unhappy. Kipper opts for the latter. He remarks that two-dimensionalism "is not committed to holding that concepts are always individuated via their primary intensions" and suggests that two people can share the same concept if the secondary intensions are identical and the primary intensions are "sufficiently similar to a degree which would still have to be specified," noting that different kinds of concepts would likely require different aspects and weights of similarity (82-83).

I find this response unhappy. We need to keep in mind that 2Dism as developed by Kipper is already committed to claims about concepts, as in the scrutability thesis that anyone who possesses the concept can, given sufficient information, determine the extension of that concept in a given scenario considered as actual. If we let "concept" be understood in this looser way, two people could possess the same concept yet arrive at distinct assignments of extensions for the same concept, since they possess that same concept by means of distinct associated primary intensions. Of course, Kipper might want to use "concept" in two different ways, but given how important claims about concepts are to the whole enterprise I would urge a more regimented way of talking about concepts.

There is a rather different sort of strategy for dealing with intersubjective variation that Kipper considers when he sets about arguing that, while communication does not require shared primary intensions, the existence of primary intensions is nonetheless necessary for enabling communication (see § As he notes, we take it to be crucial to successful communication that the hearer not only grasp the same extension but, further, the same (secondary) intension. Plausibly, this is due to the fact that preserving the secondary intension ensures the preservation of truth-value in modal contexts (159). This suggests a similar move for those sentential contexts in which epistemic possibility claims are made:

So why not argue along similar lines for the importance of shared primary intensions between speaker and hearer? For when the primary intensions of the relevant thoughts concur, this will tend to bring about agreement about epistemic possibilities. To illustrate: Whenever the primary intensions of two thoughts differ, they differ in their truth-conditions concerning at least one epistemic possibility. On the assumption that the subjects involved are rational, this implies that they will disagree over the evaluation of at least one hypothetical scenario. This can be harmful, since it implies that the subjects are disposed to draw different conclusions from potential evidence. (160)

Kipper cautions that such ideal conditions are surely not required for successful communication in any ordinary sense, and I can't disagree. But I think the point may be more important for suggesting another way of thinking about the issue of intersubjective variation.

Suppose -- as seems plausible -- that individuals often fail to associate any definite primary intension with a term and instead associate a loose cluster of such intensions with no determinate limits. Such indeterminacy may enable a kind of opportunistic precisifying. When confronted with epistemic contexts, to ensure rational agreement and/or disagreement speakers may make more determinate which primary intension is at issue, and do so in a way that promotes convergence between inquirers. On this supposition, the fact that we in fact associate different concepts (by virtue of different primary intensions) to terms is less threatening, given that there is a general mechanism of refining that tends to prevent such differences from mattering in rational discussion. In any case, I offer this as a friendly suggestion to the two-dimensionalist.

Let me turn to a second critical point regarding apriority. Here, I think there is a more serious problem. Relatively early on, Kipper distinguishes a few notions of apriority (§2.1.5). On what he calls a "standard" or "weak" notion of apriority, "a sentence (thought/proposition) is a priori if it can be known on the basis of justification which is independent of sense experience, where the relevant justification conditions are just as strong as those we impose on empirical knowledge" (39). This is distinguished from "strong apriority," which is equated with epistemic necessity: a sentence S is epistemically necessary iff it is true with respect to every epistemic possibility. The two come apart when we consider examples in which we know a conditional "if P then Q" to be true where all the empirical evidence for Q is built into P, and hence we can know independently of such evidence that if P, then Q. This conclusion is not guaranteed; perhaps P is true and Q false. But the point is that we would not need any empirical evidence to arrive with justification at the conclusion that Q, supposing P to be true.

To my surprise, Kipper claims that weak apriority is the relevant notion for the 2Dist thesis of scrutability (40). He does not explain this decision beyond an earlier remark that requiring strong apriority "makes it unnecessarily hard to acquire a priori knowledge," which "could be detrimental to the project of defending the epistemic fruitfulness of conceptual analysis" (39). On the contrary, I want to suggest that the difficulty of attaining strong a priori knowledge helps explain why conceptual analysis has met with less success than hoped. More important, however, it seems to me crucial to the use of 2Dism as a framework for such analysis that the kind of knowledge at issue in the scrutability thesis be of the strong variety.

Recall the link drawn earlier between conceptual analysis and scrutability: to get a set of conditions necessary and sufficient for the applicability of a concept C (at least of its primary intension, if not epistemically transparent), we need to consider all the possible scenarios and determine the extension of C with respect to that scenario considered as actual. If weak apriority is all that scrutability requires, however, this procedure will fail. Consider a given scenario D, expressed in canonical vocabulary. If we use the weak notion of apriority, we may conclude, on the supposition that D, that an individual a is in the extension of C -- even while we acknowledge that it might be the case both that D is true and that a is not in the extension of C. In that case, D is not sufficient for a's being in the extension, and in fact D does not determine C's extension.

Perhaps one might want to construe primary intensions as merely recording what we ought, rationally, to believe is the extension of the concept in question given various different assumed scenarios. But given Kipper's desire to ensure that conceptual analysis remains aimed at discovering what is in fact the case as opposed to what we might reasonably believe, this would be an inappropriate move.

Finally, I want to make a point about the scrutability theses Kipper defends. It is, I think, easy to underestimate the strength of these claims, since it easy to overlook the constraints put on canonical descriptions. As noted earlier, Kipper defends first the thesis CJ, which concerns the scrutability of the actual world only, then argues that we should extend it to all possible scenarios (CJ+) and, further, that this scrutability is to be understood as a priori (CJ++). In his discussion of the move from CJ to CJ+ he offers no positive argument, choosing instead to attack an argument due to Laura Schroeter for thinking that the two-dimensionalist model is inconsistent with rational belief formation (§ The upshot of his rebuttal (which I think is successful) is that the same standards should apply whether we are evaluating the actual world or some scenario merely considered as actual. This point does not connect with the worry I want to raise, however, which concerns the limitations imposed by the need to consider these scenarios using only a canonical vocabulary.

As CJ+ is stated, a subject in possession of the concept C is able, given sufficient information (in canonical and nontrivial terms) about any possible scenario, to determine the extension of C given that scenario as actual, at least where C picks out some non-fundamental aspect of reality. Kipper mentions in passing that the would-be scrutinizer is able to have access to some indexical information as well, but presumably this is limited in such a way that it excludes anything other than the identification of a center for the world (209). Now, it may be that we are confident that we could do this for any scenario given enough information provided in nontrivial terms (that is, without using C itself). We might find tempting the thought that, if we couldn't do that, then whatever C picks out must be, contrary to supposition, a fundamental feature of reality after all. But even taking all that on board, we don't have enough to establish CJ+, since that requires, further, that the sufficient information be given entirely in epistemically transparent terms.

To make the point plain, consider the following situation. Suppose there are two scenarios S1 and S2 such that (i) S1 and S2 are indiscernible with respect to any description that uses only epistemically transparent terms, (ii) the same center is specified for each; and (iii) the way they differ is still relevant to determining the extension of C on the assumption that they are actual, so that the extension of C given S1 as actual is different from the extension of C given S2 as actual. If CJ+ is true, however, this cannot happen. And it is unclear why we should think there could be no cases like this.

The main arguments Kipper gives in defense of scrutability are, in effect, arguments for thinking that if we deny scrutability we will be placed in a problematically skeptical position regarding features of reality that we regard as not fundamental. I have other worries about those arguments, but even granting their general force, they don't help with this issue. If we say that scrutability requires relaxing the constraints on descriptions to allow descriptions given using opaque concepts, then this threatens no such skeptical consequences. Perhaps we can grasp the differences between S1 and S2 perfectly well using some of our opaque concepts, so that we can still consider them as actual and arrive a priori at correctly differing extensions for C.

The above point is, I think, more pressing in light of the fact that it is not clear how many concepts count as epistemically transparent; the harder it is for a concept to be epistemically transparent, the more difficult to believe that situations like the one sketched above never occur.

Of course, two-dimensionalism in the form Kipper defends is both contentious and ambitious, and what I see as problems here may be taken as points for further work in defending the view. It is certainly the case that A Two-Dimensionalist Guide to Conceptual Analysis rewards careful study and should serve, if not as a guide, at least as a welcome and stimulating defense of a position that deserves careful engagement.