A User's Guide to Thought and Meaning

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Ray Jackendoff, A User's Guide to Thought and Meaning, Oxford University Press, 2012, 274pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199693207.

Reviewed by Tadeusz Zawidzki, George Washington University


Ray Jackendoff is a psycholinguist who has devoted his long and distinguished career to explaining natural language semantics from a cognitivist perspective. He has made important contributions to the theoretical explanation of numerous related phenomena, including: the evolution of language, the relationship between natural language semantics and thought, the nature of human concepts, the cognitive effects of language, the extent of linguistic and conceptual diversity across human cultures, the roles and roots of grammar, the nature and function of consciousness, and even the structural and cognitive analogies between music and language. Much of his earlier work is written for a specialist audience, and involves detailed, formal discussions of natural language semantics. This book distills decades of Jackendoff's work into a highly readable, concise treatment accessible to non-specialists. Its lively and engaging style is likely to spark interest in readers with little background in the subject, like undergraduates.

Besides introducing the basic issues surrounding natural language semantics and cognition, the book explores and defends a number of theses. Foremost among these is what Jackendoff calls the "perspectival perspective" (21, 244-7). This is the view that cognitive phenomena must be understood from a number of different perspectives that often seem in tension with each other. For example, in order to specify what a cognitive theory of natural language semantics must explain, Jackendoff employs what he calls the "ordinary perspective" (14, 245-7) -- our commonsense understanding of language and mind. On this understanding, language is an extra-mental system that we acquire as children to communicate truths about an external world, and that we use, in inner speech, to formulate conscious thoughts about the world. However, when we turn to the question of how we are able to accomplish this feat, Jackendoff argues that we must turn to the "cognitive perspective" (14, 245-7) -- roughly, a theory of the computations the brain must perform in order to accomplish the linguistic tasks of which, according to the ordinary perspective, language users are capable. When fully articulated, the cognitive perspective includes a number of theses that seem at odds with the ordinary perspective: (1) external language is merely "an idealization over the mental grammars . . . in the heads of its speakers" (10); (2) when we talk about the world, we are really only relating different representations in our minds to each other, e.g., "phonological structures" (43) to "conceptual structures" and "spatial structures" (122-8) which purport to be objective; (3) the internal monolog that constitutes conscious thought is merely a "handle" on the unconscious conceptual and spatial structures that do most of the work (84).

Jackendoff stresses that neither of these perspectives is the absolute, final truth on the nature of language and mind. Despite their seeming conflicts, each has an important role to play in our understanding of language and mind. The key, according to Jackendoff, is appreciating the different purposes of these different perspectives (246). When it comes to negotiating everyday life or specifying what the sciences of language and mind must explain, the ordinary perspective is appropriate. When it comes to explaining how we manage such feats, the cognitive perspective is more apposite. According to Jackendoff, these perspectives are not in conflict, once their proper roles are appreciated (246-7).

Two other important theses explored and defended in the book are: (1) the meanings of public, linguistic performances consist in language-independent, intra-mental concepts (44, 71); (2) these meanings and the inferential processes to which they contribute are entirely unconscious (49, 81-6). The first thesis is obviously highly controversial, especially to philosophers. Since the work of Kripke (1980) and Putnam (1975), a large number of philosophers have embraced externalism about meaning. I will say more about the problems with Jackendoff's repudiation of this philosophical consensus below. Here, I note only that he has a good reason for his sanguine, semantic internalism: it is integral to the cognitive perspective, because this perspective aims to explain how individuals are able to use language. If mentally representing the meanings of linguistic items is important to using them appropriately, then it does not seem controversial to claim that, from the cognitive perspective, linguistic meanings must be treated as intra-mental concepts.

The second thesis -- that meanings and the inferential processes to which they contribute are entirely unconscious -- garners more consensus among contemporary cognitive scientists than Jackendoff seems to realize. For example, he sees this claim as conflicting with Peter Carruthers' theory of conscious thought (82-4), when it is, in fact, a centerpiece of Carruthers' theory (2006). The basic idea is that we are conscious only of sensory properties and feelings. So, for example, when we think consciously in inner speech, we are aware only of the phonology of verbal imagery, together with certain feelings -- like the feeling that the speech is internally rather than externally generated, that it is meaningful rather than meaningless, that it is making a true rather than a false statement, or that it is compatible rather than incompatible with other statements. Jackendoff terms such emotional accompaniments of sensory imagery "character tags" (107). Although he later argues that conscious access to such relatively superficial properties of speech is sufficient to allow for the deliberate control of thought distinctive of human rationality -- so-called "system 2" thinking (222), his main point is that most of the work involves unconscious inferences over the meanings, i.e., unconscious conceptual structures, expressed by conscious verbal imagery.

Jackendoff's reasons for this claim are persuasive. Essentially, he applies to semantics Chomskyan arguments for unconscious knowledge of syntax. Chomsky (1957) showed that we have a lot of unconscious knowledge about natural language syntax by appealing to intuitions of syntactic well-formedness that seem rule-governed despite the fact that speakers are not conscious of these rules. Similarly, Jackendoff argues that the meanings expressed by linguistic items consist in unconscious conceptual structures, because we have rich intuitions about what can be inferred from them without any consciousness of the rules that govern these intuitions. For example, English speakers know that, while the sentence "Joe jumped until the bell rang" implies that Joe performed an action (in this case, jumping) repeatedly, the sentences "Joe jumped when the bell rang" and "Joe slept until the bell rang" do not (68-9). But, we are not, typically, conscious of the semantic rules that govern such inferential intuitions.

There are many other interesting and insightful discussions throughout the book. For example, there is a very clear and compelling critique of the traditional notion of semantic compositionality, the thesis that meanings of linguistic compounds, like sentences, are straightforward functions of the meanings of their linguistic components, i.e., words and the grammatical rules used to combine them. Jackendoff illustrates, with a number of well-chosen examples, that the semantic relationship between linguistic compounds and their components is considerably messier, and must take into account both linguistic and non-linguistic context (63-9). In another insightful discussion, Jackendoff explores the significant analogies between our linguistic and visual competencies. Again using extremely well-chosen examples, he identifies visual analogs of linguistic ambiguity, unconscious linguistic meaning, ellipsis, and meaningless sentences (114-120).

He also proposes a cognitive explanation of visual perception that is analogous to his explanation of language use: just as the mind unconsciously processes the conceptual structure underlying a linguistic item's conscious, phonological structure, it also unconsciously processes the "spatial structure" underlying a visual image's conscious, "visual surface" (121-8). Jackendoff then elegantly deploys these parallel linguistic and visual processes to explain how, for example, we are able to use language to talk about the world (155-161). Finally, Jackendoff is at his best in discussing the subtle, semantic nuances in our everyday uses of philosophically significant words, e.g., "meaning" (32-37), "truth" (187-194), and "consciousness" (92-102), as well as the inevitable vagueness that afflicts all word meanings (56-62).

Despite these many positive contributions, the book is bound to leave specialists in relevant fields unsatisfied. This is because Jackendoff does not address many of the most obvious objections to his approach; he does not explore alternative approaches to thought and meaning, and his positive views contain some glaring lacunas. Some of these oversights can be excused by the obvious intent of the book, which is meant as a concise and accessible introduction to Jackendoff's own views on meaning and cognition. However, some lacunas are just too glaring, and could easily have been acknowledged and addressed without compromising the book's rhetorical purposes.

Perhaps the most glaring oversight is the lack of in-depth discussion of the status of the cognitive explanations that Jackendoff offers of our linguistic capacities. Here, for example, is Jackendoff's explanation of how we judge a sentence describing a picture we see as true:

In response to light reflected off the picture, your mind constructs a visual surface . . . It also constructs a spatial structure and a conceptual structure . . . In response to . . . the sentence, your mind constructs a pronunciation . . . [and] a conceptual structure and . . . a spatial structure . . . because both are couched in terms of conceptual and spatial structures, your mind can compare them . . . You end up judging the sentence true if there's a match (196-7)

Jackendoff employs such explanations of cognitive competencies throughout the book. However, they are deeply unsatisfying for a number of reasons.

First, it is unclear why rephrasing what everyone acknowledges language users are able to do in a new idiom counts as explaining anything. These accounts have the flavor of Molière's infamous "virtus dormitiva" -- explaining why a substance puts people to sleep by appeal to its power to put people to sleep. Similarly, for Jackendoff, our ability to judge sentences true on the basis of what we see is explained in terms of a power to compare what sentences say with what we see. A closely related worry is that such explanations make implicit reference to a "homunculus" as intelligent as, and residing in the mind of, the person whose behavior they are meant to explain. As Dennett long ago pointed out (1978, 12), cognitivist explanations are always in danger of such vacuity. The way to avoid this is to point to independent evidence from cognitive neuroscience and cognitive psychology that neural mechanisms less intelligent than the whole agent can perform the operations posited at the cognitive level. But Jackendoff's book includes no discussion of such evidence. He begins with phenomenological descriptions of what speakers seem able to do, and then rephrases these descriptions in cognitivist terms. This may be a good first step toward a satisfying explanation, but without neural and behavioral evidence showing how neural mechanisms can implement these capacities, it risks vacuity.

Second, the cognitive-level descriptions that Jackendoff offers as explanations often employ extremely vague language that obscures the most significant explanatory questions. For example, according to Jackendoff, we are able to see an individual fork as a fork because the mind generates a spatial structure that "is linked to a conceptual structure that says this is a particular object . . . This combination of a spatial structure and a conceptual structure is matched up with the concepts of forks in general" (130, emphasis added). But what is the nature of this linking and this saying and this matching up? Jackendoff does not say. But these are the central questions of relevance here. Seeing an individual fork as a fork requires predicating the property of being a fork of the individual fork. But linking or matching up might just as easily implement a mere correlation between two separate items: the individual fork and the property of being a fork. How does the brain distinguish between such correlations and true predication? Jackendoff does not even raise the question.

There are many other such lacunas in the book. Prominent among these is Jackendoff's utter lack of engagement with philosophers he criticizes. Throughout the book he appears to mock philosophical approaches to linguistic meaning by rendering philosophers' concepts in bold, gothic font. For example, he asks: "What possible philosophical interest could there be in sequences of speech sounds? By contrast, the truths of Real Meaning are too profound to have to depend on mere people" (73). However he never actually engages with philosophers' arguments. Above, I mentioned his misreading of Carruthers' theory of conscious thought. One of the few other places where Jackendoff treats a philosopher's views at length is his discussion of David Lewis's (1969) conception of language as a public convention (11). But here he entirely misconstrues Lewis's proposal, objecting to it on the grounds that we do not consciously decide to conform to the conventions of language. When he considers that Lewis does not intend such decisions to be conscious, he assumes that this is equivalent to his view that linguistic meanings are in the head. But this does not follow. It is entirely possible that linguistic meanings are public conventions, to which we adhere by virtue of unconscious, internal mental processes, none of which employ concepts equivalent to the meanings of public language utterances.

One of Jackendoff's central claims is the explicit repudiation of the common philosophical thesis that linguistic meaning must be public. Every philosopher working in language and cognition acknowledges that some intra-mental structure must mediate linguistic behavior. The question is whether any such structures can play the roles of the meanings of public language items. There are good reasons to deny that they can. For one thing, people differ in the mental conceptualizations they associate with the same words. If Jackendoff is right then it would seem that the same words differ in meaning for different individuals. But this would make communication and disagreement impossible: if you and I mean something different by "water", for example, then how can we have disagreements about water? My point here is not that such worries are serious enough to sink Jackendoff's program. Rather, the point is that he does not even raise these sorts of questions, yet he dismisses the philosophical perspectives that they motivate.

In general, Jackendoff's book has many virtues. It is clear and concise. The pace is perfect: very short chapters making for a very enjoyable read. The index is also thorough and helpful. As an introduction to a cognitivist perspective on linguistic meaning and thought, this is an extremely helpful book in both tone and content. However, perhaps because of the constraints of a book aimed at non-specialists, the discussion is superficial in places, and contains some glaring lacunas.


Carruthers, P. (2006), The Architecture of the Mind, Oxford University Press.

Chomsky, N. (1957), Syntactic Structures, Mouton & Co.

Dennett, D. (1978), Brainstorms, MIT Press.

Kripke, S. (1980), Naming and Necessity, Harvard University Press.

Lewis, D. (1969), Convention, Harvard University Press.

Putnam, H. (1975), "The Meaning of 'Meaning", Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science 7:131-193.