A Wolf in the City: Tyranny and the Tyrant in Plato's Republic

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Cinzia Arruzza, A Wolf in the City: Tyranny and the Tyrant in Plato's Republic, Oxford University Press, 2019, 296pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190678852.

Reviewed by Richard Kraut, Northwestern University


Plato's reflections in the Republic on democracy and tyranny, and the way the former can engender the latter, now seem, in the age of Trump, more pertinent than ever. Cinzia Aruzza's study is therefore especially welcome and rewarding. She does not herself mention Trump's presidency or the features he shares with our common conception of the tyrannical character type. But she links Plato's time to our own in her concluding chapter, which refers to "the modern phenomenon of Bonapartism" -- the manipulation of the anti-elitist sentiments of the public by charismatic and demagogic leaders. Plato's "psychopathology of the tyrannical leader," she observes, "could serve as the faithful psychological portrait of a number of contemporary tyrants" (253).

Her work puts the Republic's portrait of tyranny into two larger contexts: (a) the historical events and literary texts to which Plato is responding, and (b) the way in which that portrait contributes to his larger aims in the dialogue as a whole.

With respect to (a), she argues that Plato was responding to what she calls "the crisis of Athenian democracy" -- a crisis that included two oligarchic revolutions, the rise of powerful "leaders of the people" (demagogues), and the widespread fear, expressed in literary discourse, that Athens was but one step away from its subjugation to a tyrant.

With respect to (b), she argues that Plato gives the tyrant a leading role to play in the structure of the Republic: the entire dialogue, as she reads it, is built around the contrast between philosophical and tyrannical rule. But, she adds -- and I take this to be her most important and provocative claim -- Plato's portrayal of the tyrant as a depraved and miserable human being, and of tyranny as the worst of all regimes, also plays an essential role in his critique of the democratic personality and of democratic Athens. In effect, Plato is telling his audience: "You supporters of democracy like to think of it as the opposite of tyranny. But you are wrong. Tyranny arises from democracy, because at bottom they are the same in kind. The tyrannical personality that obtains absolute power does not differ significantly from who you are or what your democracy is." This is, for Arruzza, the central political message of the dialogue.

These aspects of the book -- its setting the Republic within its historical context, and its insistence on the centrality of the tyrant in the structure of the dialogue -- take up the first half of the book. The second half is devoted to a detailed and systematic discussion of the psychology of Plato's tyrant: his greed, his sexual appetite, his shamelessness, his violent savagery (and in this respect his similarity to a common conception of a wolf). Arruzza rounds out her depiction of the tyrant by noting that, according to Plato, he also has a powerful intellect -- in fact, had he not been corrupted by his social environment, he might have become a true philosopher. He is "the philosopher's alter ego . . . a figure of extreme moral corruption, in whom exceptional natural talents are perverted" (249). With respect to intellect, then, he is unlike Trump. But, Arruzza notes, rather like Alcibiades.

She sums up her position as follows:

Plato's intention in describing such a type of man was not to provide a generalization of the features belonging to tyrants based on empirical observation of actual tyrannies. . . . Plato's depiction of tyranny mobilizes anti-tyrannical democratic tropes in order to subvert democratic discourse and undermine the purported polar opposition between the values of democracy and those of tyranny. Alcibiades, while not explicitly mentioned, lurks behind the pages devoted to the corruption of philosophical natures and represents the figure of an exceptionally talented man who, instead of following Socrates' advice to take care of his soul and practice philosophy, developed into a greedy, licentious, appetitive, and overly ambitious demagogue and scoundrel . . .  (250)

According to Arruzza, the Republic should not be read as primarily about the best condition of the soul, and only secondarily about the best condition of the polis. She notes in her introductory chapter that the Neoplatonic philosopher, Proclus, struggled with this question -- what is this work's subject matter? -- and she argues that he answered it correctly. The dialogue does have a single subject:

the discussion of the justice of the soul and of the just form of government cannot be separated from each other or ordered into a hierarchy between primary and accessory subject matter. They are, in fact, two aspects of the same justice, as there are no distinctions between justice in an individual, in a household, or in a city . . . (2)

That interpretation, it seems to me, is difficult to reconcile with what Socrates tells Glaucon in Book IV of the Republic, after it has come to light that justice in the individual soul consists in each of its three parts doing its proper job. He says:

It was . . . a sort of image of justice, this principle that it is right for someone who is, by nature, a shoemaker to practice shoemaking and nothing else . . . In truth, justice is, it seems, something of this sort. Yet it is not concerned with someone's doing his own job on the outside. On the contrary, it is concerned with what is inside; with himself, really, and the things that are his own. (443c-d, Reeve)

This shows that for Plato it is not true, as Arruzzo thinks, that "there are no distinctions between justice in an individual [and] in a city." Justice in a city consists in each citizen behaving in certain way towards other citizens; justice in the individual soul consists not in external behavior but in a feature of one's inner mental life. True, these both come under the broader rubric of a part doing its job within a larger whole. But political justice, Plato tells us, is a mere "image." What it is an image of is the primary topic of the Republic. The dialogue is more about the best state of the soul than the best state of the city. This should be obvious: Socrates turns to a depiction of the just city only in order to bring greater clarity to the great question raised in Book I and the beginning of Book II: what good is justice for someone who is just? As Socrates says, when we are trying to "identify small letters from a distance," it is of great help "if the same letters existed elsewhere in larger size and on a larger surface" (368d, Reeve). The point of looking at the large letters (justice in the city) is to able to solve the more obscure problem: what is justice within an individual?

My disagreement with Arruzza about this point allows me to accept her claim that Plato's portraits of tyranny and the tyrannical soul in Books VIII and IX play a fundamental role in carrying out the main project of the dialogue, which is to show how great a good justice is for the individual. Arruzza is of course right that Plato's way of doing this is to portray two opposite types: the most just individual (even when he is deprived of every other good) and the most unjust individual. The latter, it emerges, is the tyrannical personality who has achieved his dream and actually acquires tyrannical power.

But Arruzza insists that the critique of tyranny also plays an essential role in Plato's political project, a project she thinks is every bit as important to the Republic as its portrayal of the philosopher as the most just individual. That project is Plato's intervention in "the crisis of Athenian democracy." What Plato thinks is wrong with democracy, she argues, emerges most fully only when the reader is brought to see that democracy and tyranny, so far from being opposites (as champions of democracy typically suppose), are tightly connected. Not only does Plato allege that the former leads "naturally" and "logically" (her words) to the latter; she also claims that for Plato the demos is a tyrant -- she speaks of his "identification of the demos as a tyrant" (130, my emphasis). For just as a tyrant recognizes no authority outside of himself, so too the collective democratic citizenry recognizes nothing superior to its authority to make decisions and laws. And just as the soul of the tyrant is ruled by his appetites, so too the democratic personality type is basically hedonistic and appetitive. Arruzza therefore rejects the thesis, proposed by a number of scholars, that Plato offers a mixed picture of democracy's good and bad features. His critique, she thinks, is not "limited" but "a general rejection of democracy tout court" (123).

Is Plato therefore advising his readers to take up arms against Athenian democracy and to put in its place a city like the one depicted in the Republic? Is that his solution to "the crisis of Athenian democracy"? Arruzza, as I understand her, does not take the dialogue to have this immediate political ambition. In fact, it is far from clear whether the Republic was meant by Plato to have any direct and immediate political agenda. He seems, on the contrary, to warn his readers to avoid the ordinary business of politics (participating in councils or assemblies, holding office, and so on). Although he insists that there is nothing that would make the ideal city of the Republic an impossibility, it is only a city we might hope and pray for, not one that he supposes can be imposed by his contemporaries on democratic Athens by means of a violent revolution.

The final words of Book IX are pertinent here.

Glaucon: So he won't be willing to take part in politics . . . Socrates: Yes, in his own city, he certainly will . . . Glaucon: I understand. You mean in the city we have been founding and describing; the one that exists in words, since I do not think it exists anywhere on earth. Socrates: But there may perhaps be a model of it in the heavens for anyone who wishes to look at it and to found himself on the basis of what he sees. It makes no difference at all whether it exists anywhere or ever will. You see, he would take part in the politics of it alone, and of no other. (592a, Reeve)

The Republic, in other words, can always be put to good practical use because it tells one how one ought govern oneself and why one should do so. It is, in this respect, more about the care of the individual's soul than about intervening in democratic politics. No matter what our political circumstances, it bears on our understanding of what is valuable in human life and what is not. That does not mean that the dialogue could not, over time, make a political difference. It reveals the deficiencies of the sorts of constitutions with which its readers are familiar, and it shows how philosophical study could, in the right circumstances, ground a far better constitution. Perhaps, then, if philosophers have some influence on the values of a society, something like Kallipolis could arise. But if that is one of the ambitions Plato has for the Republic, he tells us, in so many words, that "it makes no difference at all whether it exists anywhere or ever will." By implication, then, even if we are unable to improve the societies in which we live, the depiction of an ideal polis will help Plato's readers, by providing an image of how the soul should be ruled. The dialogue's practical value, then, is primarily ethical rather than political.

I turn back now to Arruzza's thesis that for Plato democracy and tyranny are not opposites (as Athenian democrats liked to think) but rather similar in kind. I accept her claim that his depiction of tyranny adds to his critique of democracy, insofar as he presents a genetic story that shows how a democracy could lead to a tyranny. But that strikes me as an addendum to his critique of democracy, rather than a fundamental component of it, as Arruzza claims. In any case, it is not by itself a terrible fault of democracy that it could lead to tyranny. Vigorous exercise can lead to injury, but that does not show that we should abstain from it -- only that we should be cautious about it. And just as we may quickly recover from an injury, so too a tyranny might be short-lived. A democracy that endures for many generations, as Athens did, is not shown to have been ill founded and entirely bad, if it eventually produces a brief period of tyranny. So, if one of Plato's complaints about democracy is that it has the potential to degenerate into a tyranny, it is a rather weak point, and certainly not one that could stand on its own as a sufficient reason to reject democracy.

Further, the fact that in the Republic democracy is the second-worst regime should not tempt us to assume that for Plato the differences between it and the worst are of little significance. On any list of bad things, the item closest to worst might be thought by the list-maker to be much better than the worst. When we ask, as we read Books VIII and IX of the Republic, "if one had to live under a democracy or a tyranny, which would be the better alternative, so far as the population's well-being is concerned?" it is obvious how Plato would respond. He has no interest in challenging the common idea that in democracies citizens treat other citizens much better than tyrants do their subjects. His depictions of how life goes for those who are subjected to a tyrant and of what life is like in a democracy do not suggest that there is little to choose between them. There is, in other words, something inherent to democracy and something else inherent to tyranny that makes the latter far worse than the former: the injustices one must endure are far greater in a tyranny. Arruzza's interpretation loses sight of that point.

Much as I disagree with her on these issues, I have no hesitation in recommending the book enthusiastically. It is major contribution to scholarship. Its detailed analysis of the psychological condition of the tyrant is the fullest and best treatment we have of this subject. Its setting of Plato's portrait into its literary and political context is equally impressive and valuable. It is a book that should be read by every scholar and student of Plato's moral and political philosophy.