A World for Us: The Case for Phenomenalistic Idealism

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John Foster, A World for Us: The Case for Phenomenalistic Idealism, Oxford University Press, 2008, 252pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199297139.

Reviewed by William Seager, University of Toronto Scarborough


This book presents a characterization and sustained defense of a form of idealism very much akin to that of George Berkeley (to whom the work is dedicated). It is written with admirable clarity and argued with vigor and rigor. Of course, it has an agenda. The long arc of argumentation inexorably leads to the postulation of a Judeo-Christian deity who behind the scenes arranges and manipulates our perceptual experience so as to be, as Foster puts it, 'amenable to physical interpretation' or so they are, overall, 'world-suggestive'. Although this predictable ending is something of a let down, the argumentative ride is quite exhilarating and replete with interesting and insightful twists and turns. If there are places where details are skipped or the argument is somewhat sketchy, it should be borne in mind that this book brings together a number of themes for which Foster has already provided book length treatments (the general argument is a streamlined reprise of that in Foster's The Nature of Perception). This volume is refreshingly engaging and seldom descends too far into the mire of philosophical minutiae. However, despite manifold connections to philosophical work both historical and current the work is curiously insular and disengaged from active debate.

How does Foster argue for idealism? Fundamentally, the argument is a reductio ad absurdum of the hypothesis of physical realism, which is characterized by two core principles: independence and fundamentality. The first is the claim that the existence of the physical world is logically independent of consciousness (in particular, our -- human -- conscious perceptual states). Fundamentality is the claim that no aspect of the physical world is reducible to anything non-physical in either a conceptual sense (for example, in the way positivist sense-data theorists envisioned) or a constitutive sense. Although closely related the principles are distinct. The failure of fundamentality would not necessarily implicate consciousness as essential to the construction of the physical world (though consciousness is the only candidate we know of) and the essential involvement of consciousness in the existence of the physical world would not entail reducibility. Nonetheless, the natural idealist position is one in which independence fails in virtue of a constitutive role of mentality in the structure and existence of the physical world, and such is the view Foster defends.

The first step of the argument is to characterize the physical world itself. This is the world as we perceive it, consisting of solid objects moving in three dimensional space. These objects possess intrinsic qualities revealed in perception. Following Sellars, let us call this vision of the physical world the 'manifest image', although Foster allows the manifest image to be supplemented to a considerable degree by scientific accounts. According to Foster, perception involves a core phenomenological component in which the space and objects of the manifest image are presented to us as external and possessed of intrinsic qualitative features. Any analysis of the physical world must allow for these presentational facts. That is, the physical world is essentially spatial and contains extended, movable material objects, possessed of intrinsic qualitative properties (as does space itself). If space fails to meet minimal conditions imposed by perceptual experience then the physical world is at best a kind of illusion.

The analysis of perception which Foster undertakes quickly reveals that the scientific knowledge we have gained via perception of the physical world undercuts the pretension that perception does in fact yield any information about the intrinsic qualitative features of the manifest image. The qualitative features turn out to be, in some sense, properties of experiences rather than of physical objects. Worse, empirical investigation has not and cannot discover genuine intrinsic features of the physical world, but must rather rest content with complex relational, structural, dispositional or 'topic neutral' features, all ultimately revealed only in the response of consciousness to the presence of this mysterious backdrop which usurps the manifest image. (Foster's line of argument here has obvious affinities to arguments advanced by Russell, Eddington, perhaps traceable back to Leibniz, and more recently re-invigorated by Michael Lockwood and Galen Strawson, but there is no engagement of Foster with any of these philosophers.)

What is the problem here for physical realism? Can not the realist argue either (1) that the physical realm possesses unknown, perhaps unknowable, intrinsic qualitative characters which serve to ground its dispositional features, most especially its dispositions to engender certain sorts of phenomenology associated with perceptual experiences, or (2) that the physical realm needs no such intrinsic features but rather is relational through and through? Foster argues against both these dodges. He claims that endorsing the first is essentially to deny the existence of the physical world. Foster uses a strangely familiar analogy: suppose we found out that everything the Bible relates about Moses is false, save for 'his infantile adventure in the bulrushes' (p. 85). Foster urges us to consider that in such a case we would end up denying that Moses exists rather than accepting that we know next to nothing about him (there is no mention of a certain famous discussion of such cases). But why couldn't the physical realist accept that we know nothing of the intrinsic nature of the physical world but still think that the ultimate referent of 'physical world', call it X, is the independent and fundamental thing which causes our physically interpretable (in the manifest image's sense of 'physical') perceptual experiences? Foster worries that this is so open-ended as to leave the possibility that X is actually a mental entity (his example is a complex sensory field into which we are causally 'keyed'). Obviously, such a scenario is incompatible with the existence of the physical world as the realist construes it, but the physical realist has little recourse but to baldly posit that the intrinsic nature of the 'thing' which generates our world-suggestive perceptions is non-mental. The physical realist might be content with this unless and until some strong consideration arose which favored the idea that the background reality was fundamentally mental in nature.

But Foster holds that a requirement of physical realism is that our topic neutral knowledge provide for an 'adequate conception of physical space' (that is, the space of the manifest image: 3D Euclidean space). He asserts that 'there cannot be a physical world without a physical space' (p. 96). Since our topic neutral knowledge is consistent with X being radically non-spatial this requirement cannot be met and X cannot be identified with the physical world. Foster is not arguing that there can be no such X -- he in fact believes that there is though its nature is utterly at odds with anything acceptable to the physical realist -- but that our tenuous grasp on it via merely structural features prevents it from being the physical world. I think the core argument is that we must know enough about X to be able to work out how it could constitute the world of the manifest image in such a way as to endorse fundamentality and independence and to eliminate the interpretation which makes the physical world illusory.

The imagination of modern physicists and the deeply intractable problem of forging a workable conception of X might be grist for Foster's mill (though he does not consider the issue in this way). Physics apparently tells us that there are no material objects as conceived in the manifest image but only a host of 'matter fields' which under the right conditions affect our instruments in ways amenable to particle interpretation. It seems the only way to present a coherent scientific image of the world entails at least the postulation of multiple dimensions of space, and probably will require the abandonment of space (or spacetime) as fundamental. The more distant the relation between X and the manifest image, the less plausible the identification of X with the physical world.

What then of the other option: that a purely relational or structural characterization of reality is fully sufficient? The hope is, again, that such a characterization of X will enable construction of the structures which can be mapped onto (provide an adequate conception of) the features of the manifest image. This seems highly implausible. One worry is that denial of the existence of the intrinsic features seems to relegate reality to being merely a kind of shadow of pure mathematics. As Foster notes, the set of real number triples and an obvious 'metric' providing a 'distance' relation between the triples will mirror the structure of Euclidean space. What is the extra something that provides the existential oomph to generate a real physical space? How could adding more relational structure transform an abstraction into concrete reality? (Here issues in structuralism in the philosophy of science and in particular Newman's problem arise, although Foster does not engage with these in any way.)

Foster in addition presents an argument aimed at showing the incoherence of the idea of a purely relational construal of reality or what he calls the 'powers view' in which all physical entities are regarded 'as if they were merely mobile items of causal power' (p. 67). Foster argues, roughly speaking, that it is impossible to characterize all existents purely in terms of their power to affect other existents whose only character is to affect other existents. He regards this as a vicious circle and there is some cogency here in my opinion. A standard way out is to ultimately ground the powers in the response of consciousness, typically at the top end of an exceedingly complex system of dispositional powers, which is to concede the need for some intrinsic content to legitimate the system as a whole.

Foster concludes that the physical realist must regard the physical world as possessing some kind of intrinsic content whose nature turns out to be completely inscrutable. This is problematic to the extent that what we have learned about the physical world via scientific investigation tends to suggest that the reality which lies behind the manifest image does not allow for a way to see how it sustains the 'genuine' physical world of the manifest image.

This point is elaborated in a chapter Foster entitles 'The refutation of realism'. I cannot do justice to the complexity and subtlety of the argument here, but it turns on two key ideas. The first is that if the background reality, called X above (Foster calls it the 'external reality' as he has by this point already laid out the idealist alternative to physical realism), does not sufficiently 'agree' with the manifest image it will not qualify as physical reality. In the tradition of grand philosophical thought experimentation, Foster imagines a world which matches the manifest image in all respects except that two regions of X-space (corresponding to patches of Oxfordshire and Cambridgeshire in the manifest image) are switched, but in addition the laws of underlying nature are such that to all appearances in the manifest image, the correspondence is perfect. That is, at the boundaries of the switched X-regions, there is a discontinuity which transforms motion (plus all other perceptible effects) from one region instantaneously to the other (somewhat like in some computer games where the edge of the screen is mapped onto the opposite edge). Foster holds that although such a scenario is perfectly conceivable, it is clear that the physical world would be the 'smooth' world (the world as perceived). For example, in the physical world, in this scenario, is Oxford east or west of Cambridge? In the external reality, it is east of Cambridge, despite all appearances. Foster goes to some trouble to argue that 'we need to think of the physical topology as conforming to the empirically projected topology, rather than to the empirically hidden topology of the external reality' (p. 137).

The startling second key idea in the refutation of realism is that even if the structure of X matched that of the manifest image perfectly the physical world would still be properly identified with the latter rather than the former. Again to present the argument sketchily, the crucial question is why, in the thought experiment, did the manifest image structure win out over the external reality as to what should be identified with the physical world? Foster's answer is that the crucial facts have to do with how our perceptual experience (actual and possible) is ordered, even if it is granted that these are conditioned by the external reality. If so, the situation is not materially altered if external reality happens to match up with the manifest image. It is the ordering and nature of our experience that will be the metaphysical foundation of the physical world.

The idealism which Foster advocates does not deny the existence of some kind of external reality and in fact the existence of such is a condition on some features of the manifest image itself, notably its objectivity. Here rises another, perhaps rather desperate, challenge from the physical realist, which Foster calls nihilism -- the view that the physical world is an illusion and does not exist; all that really exists is what we have been calling the external reality and, undeniably but problematically, consciousness's response to it. Given this latter fact and the evident (apparent?) world-suggestive nature of experience, there is actually a close affinity between nihilism and idealism. Foster, however, sees the nihilist as inevitably suffering from a kind of skeptical paralysis which undercuts any confidence we might have in the orderliness of experience. In what is a striking echo of Sellars's famous argument against phenomenalism (though Foster does not refer to Sellars), Foster argues that it is only against the presumed existence of the physical world that we can make sense of our perceptual experiences or 'can even specify what it is about our experiences that make them orderly' (p. 170). How can an idealist make such an appeal?

This is the question that perhaps worries Foster the most: how to secure the objectivity of the physical world within the idealist account. The worry is obvious. If physical reality is constitutively dependent on consciousness (especially perceptual experience) then how can physical reality stand against experience as objective, and as the sustaining ground of the orderliness of experience itself? One might think that Foster's acceptance of the external reality which he abstractly characterizes as 'that system of control over the course of human sensory experience that disposes it to conform to its world-suggestive pattern' (p. 199) provides a sufficient, albeit indirect, source of objectivity. Although the physical world is constituted by structures and forms of experience, the external reality is independent of individual humans' beliefs and desires. No one can conjure up an apple, for example, simply by strenuous deployment of her imagination and there is no danger of our implementing the plot of Borges's 'Tlon Uqbar, Orbis Tertius' in the world as Foster conceives it.

Furthermore, there is the distinction which Foster develops between the 'mundane' and 'transcendental' frameworks. The former has to do with the physical world as we find it via perception and empirical investigation. In the mundane framework, humans arose billions of years after the Big Bang via an empirical process which our sciences have jointly gone a remarkable way towards revealing. In the transcendental framework by contrast stars, planets, organisms and everything else in the physical world are constituted out of our experience: the physical world is metaphysically dependent upon our consciousness. (Always lurking in the background is the external reality which organizes experience into its world-suggestive form.) There is no doubt that the mundane framework supports a kind of objectivity: the objectivity we find in science and commonsense realism alike.

Foster finds both the presence of the external reality and the 'internal objectivity' of the mundane framework inadequate sources of genuine objectivity. The latter is easily rejected because we are here concerned with the metaphysical situation, not the derivative features of the constituted physical world. The argument against drawing objectivity out of the external reality is somewhat obscure, but seems to be based on the idea that unless the external reality bears an appropriate relation to and partakes in the constitution of the physical world (in concert with the contribution of conscious experience) the most we can hope for is for that world to be a 'well founded' (to use Leibniz's term) illusion, or what Foster calls a 'virtual reality' or 'the experiential simulation of a world' (p. 211). Exactly how we can draw a principled distinction between the idealist construction and a virtual reality is not clear to me however. So I find it unclear why the role of the external reality of providing the ultimate existence condition for and the organization of sensory experience does not suffice to ground an acceptable metaphysical objectivity for the physical world.

But if we follow Foster we now observe the entrance of God as the sole kind of being who could operate as the external reality and stand in the appropriate existential grounding and constitutively participating relation to the physical world. God does certainly stand in a very different relation to the physical world than the bare conception of the external reality. We have, for one thing, an idea of the intrinsic nature of God insofar as he shares with us consciousness and certain (extreme forms) of our mental lives. Second, since it is God's intention that we live in the physical world he thereby takes a kind of responsibility for the overall organization of experience as such so that it is and will remain world-suggestive. One might regard this as a richer form of objectivity, one that is, in Foster's word, immanent to the physical world. The very structures of the physical world, though constituted by our experience, are guaranteed to be ordered in a way that abides by the strictures of objectivity (we also of course have an immediate application to the problem of why the mundane framework also enjoys its internal form of objectivity).

Thus Foster wends an intricate argumentative path to end up with a view very similar to that of Berkeley. At each stage of the argument a host of interesting objections and difficulties could be raised. It is also noteable that one can retreat along the path of the argument and find intriguing intermediate positions. For example, one could endorse a form of idealism which holds that while the physical world (the manifest image) is constituted by and dependent on consciousness, it ultimately owes its existence to a more or less inscrutable external reality. And it may be that some of this background reality's relational or structural features could be explored by the kind of physics, now being developed to tackle the problems of integrating quantum mechanics and general relativity, which posits a world so utterly removed from our ordinary conception of reality that it may lack space, time and objects.