A World without Values: Essays on John Mackie's Moral Error Theory

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Richard Joyce and Simon Kirchin (eds.), A World without Values: Essays on John Mackie's Moral Error Theory, Springer, 2010, 238 pp., $139.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789048133383.

Reviewed by Hallvard Lillehammer, Cambridge University



There is an unflattering image associated with the title of ‘error theorist’ in contemporary moral philosophy. It is the image of a dangerous amateur enthusiast who insists on seeing rituals of magic and witchcraft in everything recognizably moral; a self-proclaimed Grand Inquisitor of the crudest form of scientism. The fact that this image remains current is no accident. Until recently the moral error theorist was rarely seen on the big philosophical stage, making only brief appearances, and then mainly in caricature. Back then, error theorists were more likely to be found away from philosophy’s Broadway, as authors of popular science books or proponents of dubious forms of interdisciplinarity, such as sociobiology. All that has changed. Over the last decade or so, the error theory has made a significant breakthrough in English speaking moral philosophy. Replacing the image of the amateur enthusiast is that of the professional forensic analyst, impartially exposing the objective aspirations of moral discourse and its natural and contingent causes. This change is partly due to the influence of J. L. Mackie’s Ethics: Inventing Right and Wrong. A World without Values is a substantially expanded version of a 2007 special issue of Ethical Theory and Moral Practice published to mark the thirtieth anniversary of Mackie’s book. It contains some of the best contemporary evaluations to date both of Mackie’s error theory and of its wider philosophical significance. It is also the first multi-authored work on this scale devoted exclusively to this topic. As such, it is a significant event.

The papers in A World without Values can be divided into two groups, depending on the extent to which they take a sympathetic view of Mackie’s overall project. In the first, and mainly sympathetic, group can be counted the papers by John P. Burgess, Charles Pigden, Richard Joyce, David Phillips, Walter Sinnott-Armstrong, Caroline West and Richard Garner. In the second, and less sympathetic, group can be counted the papers by Graham Oddie and Daniel Demetriou, Michael Smith, David Copp, Jamie Dreier, Don Loeb and Simon Kirchin.

The volume opens with Burgess’s paper ‘Against Ethics’, a defense of the error theory (or ‘anethicism’ as he calls it). This paper was originally written in the mid-1970’s, but never published until the 2007 special issue. It is both fortunate and fitting that the editors have been able to convince Burgess to let his paper be published here. Fortunate, because the paper is now available to those who have hitherto known about it only second-hand. Fitting, because it allows us to trace the rising interest in the error theory to another source than Mackie’s apparently futile attempt to sell it to his Oxford contemporaries in the mid-1970’s. Starting with Burgess, in a Princeton environment justly celebrated for tolerating belief in the seemingly unbelievable, there was apparently room for the error theory to be nourished until it emerged in its contemporary incarnation as the ‘moral fictionalism’ currently propounded by Richard Joyce and Mark Kalderon, among others. The historical significance of a stimulating environment for unpopular ideas should never be underestimated. In Britain it was virtually impossible to talk seriously about the error theory in civilized philosophical company until the late 1990s.

Pigden’s paper also defends the error theory. His paper has two aims. The first is to argue that Nietzsche was an error theorist. The second is to formulate a version of the error theory that avoids the unwelcome conclusion that everything describable as a moral claim is embroiled in error. The solution is to restrict the error-theoretic hypothesis to claim that all non-negative atomic moral propositions are false. In defending this solution, Pigden usefully addresses the view associated with Ronald Dworkin among others, that to endorse an error theory is to implicitly endorse a set of objectionable first order values. Pigden’s diagnosis is intended to dispatch this objection to the philosophical hinterland and to save the project of pure metaethics from the zealotry of those who think that all forms of moral antirealism smell of sulphur. To say that we are valuers in a valueless world is not to dismiss everything as worthless. So what exactly is the difference? To answer this question, we have to engage with a series of issues about language, truth and ontology that make only a marginal appearance in A World without Values. Some of these issues are familiar from the debate surrounding the view made famous by Simon Blackburn under the label ‘quasi-realism’. What does it mean, beyond adding a note of gravitas, to say that moral claims are true? What follows from this claim by way of ontological commitment? What follows about the metaphysics of morality from our endorsement of counterfactuals in which we assume that the truth stays the same although our attitudes do not, beyond the platitude that we don’t consider ourselves to be infallible? In what sense, if any, does taking a view about the status of such conditionals amount to something more than endorsing a substantial moral view? This debate is far from reaching its natural point of exhaustion. No doubt we will soon be hearing from Dworkin and his allies again.

Joyce’s paper is targeted at a section of Mackie’s book that follows immediately after the sections containing his notorious arguments from Relativity and Queerness. The section is entitled ‘Patterns of Objectification’. What exactly did Mackie mean by ‘objectification’? What role, if any, does this idea play in his argument for the error theory? Joyce argues that by muddling together a potentially plausible psychological story about projection with his wider metaphysical ambitions, Mackie failed to successfully put the idea of objectification to work in his argument for the error theory.

Phillips’s paper attempts to clarify the view of practical reason embodied in Mackie’s argument. Contrasting Mackie’s view with the superficially similar view associated with Bernard Williams, Phillips claims that Mackie’s account of practical reason is more plausible. According to Williams, there are genuinely normative reasons for action, but all of them obtain relative to an agent’s motivations. According to Mackie, there are no genuinely normative reasons for action. Phillips argues that so understood, Mackie’s error theory avoids a well-known problem facing any account along Williams’s lines. The problem is that it is not obviously possible to give a naturalistic account of practical reasons while claiming that some practical reasons are genuinely normative.

Sinnott-Armstrong’s paper aims to clarify Mackie’s notoriously ambiguous claim that morality purports to have a special motivational force built into it. Distinguishing between at least nineteen different kinds of internalism, he argues that the kind required by Mackie’s error theory is some form of motivation internalism, possibly limited to first-person present-tense judgements, and with a strong conceptual connection between those judgements and some kind of (not necessarily overriding) motivation.

The role of internalism in moral thought is also the focus of West’s contribution. According to West, the function of moral thought depends on the widespread belief that there is a rational requirement for people to be motivated by their moral judgements. So what should we do if we have to conclude, as West hints we might, that internalism is false? She offers two alternatives. The first is the ‘revolutionary non-cognitivist fictionalism’ recently defended by Richard Joyce, according to which we should carry on engaging in moral thought, but avoid literal assertion or genuine belief. The second is the ‘revisionist realism’ associated with David Lewis and others, according to which we should reinterpret the commitments embodied in moral thought to avoid the problematic aspirations to objectivity that form the target of Mackie’s arguments. West’s intriguing suggestion is that what begins as an instance of the former could end as an instance of the latter. More on this below.

Garner fittingly finishes off the collection by proposing that morality be abolished. According to Garner, the fictionalist alternative is ‘dangerous because it undermines our integrity by forcing us to find ways to defend things we know to be false’ (232). Much better, he thinks, to get rid of the whole thing altogether. Indeed, he suggests that doing so could be a necessary means to ends that fictionalists and ‘well-meaning moralists’ have in common, such as preventing misery, strife and war. With moral belief comes moral fanaticism. In response to this danger, abolition is liberation.

One might be tempted to draw a similar conclusion from Oddie and Demetriou’s paper, at least on the assumption that the error theory is true. Oddie and Demetriou, however, do not make this assumption. Instead, they confine their argument to one specific development of the fictionalist programme recently developed by Mark Kalderon. On this view, moral claims have genuine representational content (factualism) but to accept a moral claim is to express a non-cognitive attitude (non-cognitivism). Oddie and Demetriou argue that this kind of ‘noncognitivist factualism’ fails to account for why it is rational to transfer acceptance to the logical consequences of propositions we have good reasons to accept. The source of this problem is the fictionalist commitment to a multi-attitude account of acceptance. Its broad outlines will be familiar to those versed in the ‘mixed inference’ versions of the ‘Frege-Geach’ problem for expressivism. Kalderon’s fictionalism is apparently faced with a similar ‘attitude problem’.

At this point the reader may ask if things have gone too far. Perhaps we should retrace our steps. The second group of papers do just that by offering alternative ways to avoid the error-theory. Smith’s contribution consists in a partial defense of his ‘constitutivist’ approach to moral objectivity. According to this view, Mackie is right that morality presents us with ‘absolute’ requirements of reason. Yet all this means is that having a set of moral commitments is constitutive of being fully rational, as given by the desires we would have if we knew the relevant facts and made our attitudes coherent. Thus understood, moral objectivity does not require the existence of metaphysically mysterious moral facts. As Smith is fully aware, however, it might require a degree of convergence among the desires of fully rational agents that is hard to guarantee a priori. Copp’s contribution suggests a more pluralistic approach to what is essentially the same problem. On his view, there are self-grounded reasons that are instrumentally authoritative and moral reasons that are morally authoritative. Yet there is no basis for thinking that only one of these could be ‘genuinely’ normative. To think that moral authority is dubious unless it is reducible to rational authority is to accord excessive respect to ‘rationality’.

Another way of retracing our steps is to question our handle on exactly what it is that moral claims commit us to. Dreier’s contribution begins to do just that. Dreier argues for the prima facie preposterous claim that Mackie was a moral realist. On closer reading, however, Dreier’s argument brings out an illuminating insight about two conflicting conceptions of the order of philosophical explanation. As Dreier uses the term, ‘realists’ look for an account of the puzzling features of moral claims in the subject matter of that discourse, namely a realm of moral facts. It is in this sense that Mackie is a realist, claiming that such an account is needed to vindicate the objective aspirations of moral claims but also that no such account exists. Expressivists, on the other hand, look for an account of the puzzling features of moral claims in moral concepts, moral language or the psychology of moral agents. The subtext is that Mackie and his doubly ‘realist’ competitors may both have got things the wrong way round.

A similar kind of challenge is offered in Loeb’s contribution. Loeb’s paper is partly an attack on the claim that the objective-seeming nature of our moral experience creates a presumption in favour of realism. Loeb denies this claim, arguing that even if morality did present us with a realist appearance, this would not constitute even presumptive evidence in its favour. To this extent, his aims are sympathetic to those of the error theorist. However, on his way to this conclusion Loeb also asks if we should accept the realist description of the appearances. His answer is that we should not. Our experience of moral objectivity is a messy, inconclusive and theory-laden affair. The same line of thought is developed by Simon Kirchin, who argues that there is an inherent tension in the error theory. On the one hand, the error theorist needs to isolate a determinate set of claims to which ordinary thought is mistakenly committed. On the other hand, the more precisely these claims are specified the less plausible it is to think that moral discourse is inextricably committed to them. Kirchin’s suspicion is that in his efforts to place the whole of moral thought before the hangman the error theorist has to present it in the form of a straw man.

I share Kirchin’s concern. Thirty years after Ethics, it remains unclear which among Mackie’s target claims are genuinely indispensable to moral thought, in the sense that to give them up is to change the subject. Suppose I deny that moral truth can transcend the human capacity to discern it. Must I then deny ‘morality’? Suppose I deny that all rational agents would converge on the same desires in a state of reflective equilibrium. Must I then deny ‘morality’? Suppose I deny that moral beliefs entail corresponding motivations, even in fully rational agents. Must I then deny ‘morality’? There are at least two considerations that speak against this hypothesis. First, not a single one of the claims just cited expresses a directly practical recommendation. Second, if the body of claims I must accept in order to count as engaging in moral thought is holistic or theory laden it is hard to say precisely where ‘morality’ stops and ‘schmorality’ begins. For all we know, there could be less radical ways of accepting Mackie’s naturalistic worldview than denying ‘morality’ as such. One option is to be skeptical about specific historical manifestations of moral thought, such as the view of moral obligation attacked by Williams in Ethics and the Limits of Philosophy under the name ‘the morality system’. To evaluate this and similar proposals we would arguably need to be more suspicious than many of us have been about claims to have discovered some ‘constitutive’ element embodied in moral thought and language. One man’s bread is another man’s sport. Either way, it is safe to predict that the debate between the error theory and its opponents will continue unabated for years to come.