A World Without Why

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Raymond Geuss, A World Without Why, Princeton University Press, 2014, 264pp., $39.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780691155883.

Reviewed by Matt Sleat, University of Sheffield


There is an interview available on the internet in which Raymond Geuss walks through a graveyard, gesticulating animatedly but gently, and reflecting upon the vocation of philosophy.[1] Philosophy, we are told, is nothing other than Geuss' means for survival in an otherwise horrible world, employing the talents that he was lucky enough to be endowed with to live a slightly more comfortable life than he might otherwise have had. While philosophy is not a calling, he comforts us that it is nevertheless 'of some use' to a few students each year and, thankfully, 'not reprehensible'. And in the title chapter of his new book, Geuss describes teaching philosophy as 'a mildly discreditable day job' largely directed towards churning out the next generation of civil servants and commercial elites. One might be inclined to think that all this is a form of glib self-deprecation from a distinguished and by all accounts successful professor of philosophy, possibly reflecting back upon his life's work and its meaning (or lack of) upon his retirement. Yet it is obvious from the unremittingly bleak view of the world and of philosophy's place in it that Geuss presents in A World Without Why that there is little more to be said for the value of philosophical endeavours. Philosophy is 'a kind of comedy without the humour' (p. 207).

If this sounds like an austere, instrumental, and unwelcoming vision of philosophy, it is supposed to. In a wonderfully Dostoyevskian passage that would not look out of place in Notes from the Underground, Geuss pronounces that:

the experience I have of my everyday work environment is of a conformist, claustrophobic, and repressive verbal universe, a penitential domain of reason-mongering in which hyperactivity in detail -- the endlessly repeated shouts of "why," the rebuttals, calls for "evidence," qualifications, and quibbles -- stands in stark contrast to the immobility and self-referentiality of the structure as a whole. I suffer from recurrent bouts of nausea in the face of this densely woven tissue of "arguments," most of which are nothing but blinds for something else altogether, generally something unsavoury; and I feel an urgent need to exit from it altogether (p. 232).

The 'world without why' that Geuss seeks to reveal is one free from such intellectual repression and sickness-inducing argumentation. Geuss' particular 'method', if one can call it that, for effecting this getaway is through the juxtaposition of objects, stories, practices, persons, or events not usually scrutinised together as a way of disclosing that which is often overlooked or taken for granted, or to reveal the way in which assumed unity dissolves upon inspection. Such philosophical rearrangement does not necessarily require argumentation, theorisation, critique, or clarity; at least not as those terms have usually (if obliquely) been understood. Indeed, if what one is looking to achieve through philosophy are moments that break down familiar forms of everyday speech, to question the anchored universal rationalisations of our existing structures, or to create positive new meanings or modes of living, then we are told in two of the most illuminating chapters of the book that obscurity might even be a virtue and that the demand to provide a constructive alternative as part of any responsible critique (something that Geuss has often been charged with lacking) is actually a repressive claim intended to avert the possibility of radical criticism. Geussian philosophy valorises what traditional philosophy considers cardinal vices.

There is no doubt that several of the highlights of the book come about through such juxtaposition. We are reminded how relationships between practices, including those of philosophy, are completely contingent through recounting how music used to be part of the required training of a Roman architect (because architects were also required to design military artillery, and the only way they could judge if catapults would shoot straight was through checking that the ropes were equally taut, which in the absence of any appropriate technology required them to pluck the ropes to check that they produced the same note). Two stories of a boy at a pond -- Narcissus' obsession with his watery reflection and Hegel's image of a child throwing stones into the water -- are means through which Geuss discusses the possibility of meaning in modern society. And the ambiguous advice offered by Apollo to King Pyrrhus of Epirus is used to explore our contemporary philosophical obsession with clarity. And all are employed with good effect.

Yet this approach is also a cause of some of the more perplexing moments in the book. The chapter 'Politics and Architecture' contains some of Geuss' clearest thoughts on the nature of politics and is important in that regard. Yet in attempting to use architecture as the means to critique contemporary liberal theory, including it's almost exclusive focus on justice, it is far from clear that light has been shed on either. When Geuss tells us that

architecture would do well to concentrate on the generation and fostering of varieties of free activity and on the structure of the relations that will hold between the humans who need to interact, rather than on justice in the sense of either conformity to some code or the distribution of goods (p. 159)

it is hard to know exactly who would have thought architecture has much to do with justice in the first place, nor who would possibly think otherwise. Neither is it obvious how the 'passively coercive' nature of architecture (by the mere fact that it plays some role in channelling human activities) illuminates the apparently skewed focus in contemporary liberal theory on the use of active coercion.

Not that it is necessarily true that liberal theory has had such a distorted understanding of coercion and politics. Clearly Geuss has not been keeping up with the vast literature on global justice or just war theory, where discussions of active and passive forms of coercion and the various responsibilities and obligations that these generate are absolutely critical (and have been for some time). And it is hard to really think that John Rawls and his followers' interest in justice does not at least in part stem precisely from a concern regarding the effects of 'soft' coercion. Such bold, sweeping, and (more importantly) unsubstantiated claims regarding liberal political theory will no doubt reawaken accusations that Geuss has at best caricatured his opponents, at worst purposefully and grossly misinterpreted them.

We might put such lack of concern with a truthful account of those with whom he disagrees as a consequence of his attempt to inhabit a 'world without why' (accurate interpretations of others' arguments could also be a dogma of traditional philosophy that leaves Geuss feeling queasy). After all, we know from much of his other previous work -- such as The Idea of a Critical Theory, History and Illusion in Politics, and especially when he discusses those with whom he is more sympathetic such as Nietzsche and Adorno -- that Geuss can be a sensitive and insightful reader.[2] One cannot therefore help feeling that he evidently no longer considers certain writers or arguments to merit the effort or attention. This is deeply regrettable, not least because there is no doubt that the 'uncharitable' way in which Geuss paints his intellectual enemies leaves a bitter impression that continues to detract from what are otherwise original discussions and creates the suspicion that there is something inherently duplicitous in his attempt to lure the reader into a new way of doing philosophy that ought to be resisted.

That his late friend Bernard Williams is subject to such misreadings is particularly surprising, but also illuminating. While Williams appears a few times throughout the book, and anyone familiar with Williams' work will recognise very similar themes and discussions on several occasions, Geuss' disagreements with his former colleague are the exclusive focus of one of the most interesting chapters in the book. We learn that Geuss was perennially disappointed by Williams' ongoing commitment to liberalism, despite the fact that Williams shared so many of Geuss' qualms about contemporary moral and political philosophy. Regardless of his reading of Nieztsche and an appreciation for the ancient tragedians, Williams' political writings 'still breath the air of the usual liberal platitudes' (p. 187). This commitment to liberalism Geuss quite incredibly puts down to Williams having been an inherently optimistic and cheerful character 'remarkably comfortable in his own skin' (p. 184) and too at ease in his position at Cambridge (I'm not sure how relatively uncomfortable Geuss' position was before his retirement).

It's not clear whether this optimism and cheerfulness is something that ailed Williams until the end of his life; certainly one could read much of his later political work and his conversion to Judith Shklar's liberalism of fear as a considerable reining in of his confidence in liberal politics. And the claim that Williams thought that ethics would be replaced by 'real politics' borders on the outlandish. But ultimately Geuss' disagreement with Williams seems to be more personal than philosophical (though in comparison with his recollections of Richard Rorty in Politics and the Imagination, which also draws attention to Geuss' personal disappointment with Rorty's politics, significantly less vehement).[3] Williams held out hope that we could make sense of liberalism; Geuss resigned himself to its irreparable incoherence. Geuss thought Williams just lacked the courage to accept that we are doomed to living lives that are politically and ethically confused. This was a possibility that Williams entertained, but until the end of his life searched for ways to overcome. Depending on your perspective, Geuss either has the inner strength Williams lacked to stare into the abyss or lacks Williams' hopefulness that we may retain just enough intellectual resources to help make sense of ourselves and our world.

But it is not only that liberalism is incoherent. Our predicament is worse than that. We have no viable alternative to bumbling and blundering our way through liberal politics, trying our best to carve out meaningful lives in societies the key concepts of which just cannot hang together in a manner that is coherent (the key theme of his earlier History and Illusion in Politics). In 'Marxism and the Ethos of the Twentieth Century' Geuss laments that the only viable alternative to liberalism is Marxism, that only Marxism offered the resources to overcome the ambiguities and incoherences laid bare by Nietzsche, but that politically there is not the slightest chance that there will be any turn to Marxism any time soon. (That Williams was never a Marxist but rather an old school Labour social democrat is no doubt important in explaining Geuss' personal disappointment. The gap between where Geuss thought Williams should have been -- Marxism -- to where he ended up -- liberalism -- is much wider than the journey that Williams perceived he made).

The story is defeatist and familiar: we had our chance at salvation, but instead embellished our chains. And while the fall of Soviet communism is crucial in understanding why Marxism is no longer a viable option, we are told that this had little to do with its authoritarian character (which is more than a little implausible), but was rather down to the fact that the USSR was unable to construct a viable non-capitalist value system and so had to adopt US-style consumerism, but without the production capacity to satisfy the needs that this generated. Soviet leaders were powerless to produce the ideational and motivational support among their populations, such that by the end even the leaders themselves found themselves unable to live the lie that there was a plausible alternative evaluative system according to which Soviet-style societies could be deemed good. So we lack even a plausible theoretical alternative to liberal capitalism.

As mentioned at the beginning, Geuss finds that in any one year philosophy proves to be of any use to only a handful of his students. I can't claim to have a better success rate with my own teaching of political philosophy, but I wonder whether part of Geuss' difficulty is that his conclusion that modern moral and political philosophy is radically incoherent and that we lack any plausible alternatives must be a position that we have to arrive at (if we ever do) individually and as the result of our own distinct intellectual journeys. What Geuss presents is the culmination of his own unique intellectual voyage. It is too bleak and defeatist a world-view for many to easily accept, especially during the ambitious optimism of youth when the world seems to have no restraints on what is possible other than human will. But, and more importantly, it runs profoundly against the grain of the Enlightenment ideals of a world based on reason and morality that remains at the very heart of our intellectual culture. To abandon this therefore represents a serious intellectual struggle, a different vision of the world that we have to work ourselves towards through grappling seriously with any number of those thinkers who stand in an antagonistic relationship to the Enlightenment. Williams got there through Berlin and Nietzsche, MacIntyre through Aristotle and Augustine, Rorty through Dewey and Derrida, and Geuss through Nieztsche and Adorno. What lies at the end of such a difficult journey and why should we want to make it? Each theorist has his or her own answer as to how we and our world will look once we reach our intellectual destination. What lies at the end of Geuss' road is the conquering of false hope and the full stark appreciation of our bleak desperate reality as it really is. That is a hard sell.

Geuss describes his way of doing philosophy as an invitation to leave moral and political philosophy as it has traditionally been perceived in favour of a more poetic and transformative practice. Like all invitations it is one that we can decline, though we can do so with varying degree of openness and civility. There is little doubt that this new volume will do little to assuage the most hostile critics of Geuss, who will surely find in it confirmation of their view that he gave up doing philosophy a long time ago. I do not share that view. There is true insight, originality and even occasional wit here if one is willing to see it (though I'm not always sure whether the humour is intentional -- as when he calls Arendt a journalist or claims that Heidegger explained something with 'perfect clarity'). And what he manages to present is unquestionably a fascinating alternative way of thinking about and doing political philosophy from that which currently dominates the discipline, though one that meets with varied degrees of success (though in that it need not necessarily be different from other approaches). His vision of 'a world without why' is bleak and it is unrelenting. And he may well be right. But that is something we will likely need to discover for ourselves.

[1] Accessed 19/05/2014.

[2] Geuss, R. The Idea of a Critical Theory (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1981); Geuss, R. History and Illusion in Politics (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001).

[3] Geuss, R. Politics and the Imagination (Oxford: Princeton University Press, 2010), ch. 10.