A Yogācāra Buddhist Theory of Metaphor

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Roy Tzohar, A Yogācāra Buddhist Theory of Metaphor, Oxford University Press, 2018, 296pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190664398.

Reviewed by Malcolm Keating, Yale-NUS College


Indian philosophy has a history of sophisticated linguistic analysis (Pāṇini's grammar being the usual example), which includes theories of reference, polysemy, ellipsis, sentential unity, figurative language, and more. Roy Tzohar's A Yogācāra Buddhist Theory of Metaphor is a sustained argument for attending both to the intertextual nature of Indian philosophy and to the philosophical importance of topics such as metaphor and figurative language. Tzohar's central thesis is that Sthiramati, a fifth- or sixth-century CE Indian Buddhist thinker, has a theory of metaphor ("metaphor" being Tzohar's preferred translation of the Sanskrit upacāra) which can be understood more broadly as a theory of meaning.

The book has three parts. In Part One, Tzohar lays out the brahminical context -- that is, the writings of Vedic-affirming thinkers on upacāra -- from which he argues that early Buddhist philosophers are borrowing. Chapter One focuses on early Nyāya and Mīmāṃsā, while Chapter Two takes up Bhartṛhari's Vākyapadīya (Treatise on Sentences and Words, VP), through the lenses of two commentators, Helārāja and Puṅyarāja. In Part Two, he looks at early Buddhist discussion of upacāra, in particular the works of Asaṅga (Chapter Three), Vasubandhu's Abhidharmakośabhāṣya (Commentary on the Treasury of Abhidharma, AKBh), and the Laṅkāvatārasūtra (Descent into Laṅkā Scripture, LAS), whose author is unknown, as well as Dignāga's discussion in the fifth chapter of the Pramāṇasamuccaya (Collection on Reliable Knowledge, PS), all of the last in Chapter Four. Part Three focuses on Sthiramati, whose commentary on the Triṃśikā (Treatise in Thirty Verses, Triṃś) uses brahminical examples of figurative speech in explaining Triṃśikā's interpretively controversial opening verse. In the last two chapters, Tzohar argues first (Chapter Five) that Sthiramati has a "pan-figurative" theory of meaning, and second (Chapter Six), that this theory is a way for Buddhists to avoid the charge that their nominalism leads to incommensurable conceptual schemes.

The impressive range of material Tzohar covers is also a drawback: the book is philologically dense, and finding the argumentative thread is sometimes difficult. Tzohar lays out his argument more narratively than structurally. One will not find his arguments represented in a schematic way. Numbered lists to present arguments sometimes appear (107), but they are dense and not written in a recognizable argumentative pattern (such as being deductively valid, inductively strong, and so on). Such a schematic approach, as is common in contemporary analytic philosophy, is certainly not the only way of presenting one's arguments, but a distilled presentation of what is essential, textually and conceptually, would orient readers to where they are in Tzohar's argument.

Given the amount of material covered in just under three hundred pages, readers new to Indian philosophy may find themselves overwhelmed. Including a table of authors, texts, and estimated dates would have been a helpful addition for non-specialists. In addition, given the importance of relative chronology for some of Tzohar's arguments about Buddhist sources (Chapter Three), having his reconstructed timeline in one place would be helpful for specialists. Likewise, given the centrality of Sthiramati's commentary to Tzohar's arguments, appending a translation of sections of that text (as yet unpublished in English) in addition to, or in place of, Bhartṛhari's VP, would have been helpful.

One of the positive aspects of Tzohar's work is that it draws attention to a range of philosophically challenging discussions of language in Indian philosophy that merit more attention. As he points out in his introduction, few studies of figurative language in Buddhist philosophy exist, and those which do tend to focus on contemporary thinking about metaphor (3). The same can be said, I would add, for studies of figurative language in non-Buddhist texts (brahminical or otherwise). Insofar as Tzohar shows the interdependence between Buddhist and brahminical thinking about hermeneutics and linguistic philosophy, his book succeeds in its argument for attending to the intertextual nature of Indian philosophy. As Tzohar points out (206), understanding early texts such as these can help us in our understanding of later developments in poetics, where systematic theorizing about the relationship between thought and language occurs, drawing on both Buddhist and brahminical sources.

Yet a challenge in following Tzohar's arguments on upacāra itself is that he does not define his use of key terms from modern philosophy: "metaphor," for one, "correspondence theory," "contextualism," or even "semantics" and "pragmatics," the meanings of which could be made precise. For example, Tzohar concludes that Mīmāṃsā has a "quasi-antirealist conception of language" (41) on the basis of their view that words refer first to universals and then, derivatively (in his terms, "figuratively") to particulars. But typically (in analytic philosophy) realism about language (semantic realism) means that when someone asserts a sentence p, that sentence is true or false independent of our ability to ascertain that it is true or false. That Mīmāṃsā theories of linguistic reference may involve something akin to sort-shifting (as I have argued in an article which Tzohar cites, Keating 2013) is orthogonal to their commitment to semantic realism.

These kinds of issues are found throughout the text, but rather than enumerate them, or proceed chapter-by-chapter, I will summarize Tzohar's main claims about Sthiramati, reconstruct his arguments to support them, and then remark on one or two areas of difficulty.

Tzohar argues for three main conclusions about Sthiramati's view of language:

1. Sthiramati holds a pan-metaphorical theory of meaning (PMTM).

On a "pan-metaphorical" (153ff) or "pan-figurative" (154, 160, 166) theory of meaning, the referent of a word is a causal psychological process responsible for the putative "object" which appears to our cognitive processes. The word's sense is a description of that causal process. This theory is "metaphorical" in the sense that the putative "objects" (ordinary things like people and chairs) are absent from their "loci of reference" (169), which is taken by most speakers to be the external world.

2. The PMTM has two negative uses.

It is used by Sthiramati to argue against two positions:

a. A correspondence theory of meaning whose adherents are not named by Sthiramati (161-172)
b. A Madhyamaka Buddhist radical conventionalism about meaning (173-177).

3. The PMTM has a positive use.

The PMTM is used by Sthiramati to argue for the meaningfulness of ordinary discourse. This allows Buddhists to avoid the charge of incommensurability. It also explains how bodhisattvas (enlightened beings who remain in the world to assist others along the Buddhist path) engage in linguistic practices. This is despite the fact that, as "perfected" beings, they have "nonconceptual awareness," which "precludes any kind of intentional content or the possibility of communication" (187).

Tzohar uses two strategies to argue for these three conclusions. First, he engages in sustained textual analysis, attending to questions of authorship, relative and absolute chronology, intertextual borrowing, and the development of central Sanskrit terms (and their Tibetan and Pāli equivalents) over time. Second, Tzohar engages in constructive philosophy in which he draws on categories from modern Anglophone (European-American) philosophy, drawing on thinkers ranging from Habermas to Kripke to Putnam, though making the heaviest use of Putnam.

Philosophically, what is interesting about Tzohar's reconstruction of Sthiramati is that he, like Gold (2007) before him, has tried to understand it as a "pan-figurative" or "pan-metaphorical" account of meaning. Postponing for the moment whether this is Sthiramati's view, the idea that one could derive a theory of sense and reference (166-173) modeled on metaphor or figurative language is intriguing, since typically theories of metaphor are taken to be derivative from theories of language, not the other way around. Tzohar calls his reconstruction of Sthiramati's view a "causal figurative theory of sense," arguing that on this theory, words refer to imagined entities and not real ones (176).

To explain, I'll use "r-metaphor" for Tzohar's notion of referential metaphor, to distinguish it from the usual use of the term "metaphor." All language would be r-metaphorical in the sense that saying "There is the sun" does not refer to a real sun. Tzohar argues that on Sthiramati's view, when we say "There is the sun," the referent of "sun" would be the causal process which results in a sun-like object in our consciousness, a process involving no suns and no selves, but merely a causal chain of mental events (169). An ordinary person thinks that words like "sun" or "self" refer to an objectively existing thing, but a bodhisattva understands that they instead refer to consciousness (170). Yogācāra Buddhists argue that progress along the Buddhist path enables people to change their understanding of their relationship between their (not genuinely independent) selves and (not genuinely independent) reality. For this reason, Tzohar argues that words have varying senses, which are "roughly the description of the causal process in terms of the Yogācāra model of consciousness" (169). At the same time, we would still have metaphorical language that is "second-order" (167), as when we say "Juliet is the sun." Unfortunately, Tzohar does not explain how to distinguish metaphorical from r-metaphorical language, or their relationship.

Tzohar says that on this view, "a reference of a term is fixed for a variety of speakers" even though "its meaning changes from one speaker to another" (171), arguing that this is a feature shared with "contemporary causal theories of reference" (170). In support of this connection, which he makes specifically with Putnam, after Gold (2007), though in less detail, he cites Ben-Menahem (2005) appreciatively (171, fn. 28). However, there is a significant difference between this Yogācāra causal theory and Putnam's, made explicit in Ben-Menahem's own characterization of Putnam: "The causal theory of reference ensures that speakers can have different ideas about a particular entity, and thus be in different mental states, while still referring to the same entity through causal chains terminating in that entity" (137, italics mine). But as presented, the pan-metaphorical theory of meaning has a serious problem: given that mental states of a bodhisattva and ordinary person will differ, how can they share the same referent? Sthiramati's causal chains terminate in psychological processes, not external entities. Appeal to similarity between types of causal activities is not available to the Buddhists, only causal streams, which we call "human" or "animal" because they are usefully so grouped, but not because they have any underlying shared nature (194-96).

Chapter 6 attempts to resolve the issue of incommensurability, with discussion of arguments from Asaṅga as well as Vasubandhu. Sameness of reference grounded in mental activity is intended to secure shared discourse, while allowing for differences among people on various points of the Buddhist path. The main thesis of this chapter seems to be that natural kinds (human beings, animals, etc.) are defined in terms of "different patterns of mental continuums" (195) and that these different patterns constrain experience and conceptualization (196), allowing similar beings to share an experienced world and referential content (197). Yet if "each individual experience" involves "irreducible differences," (201) it is difficult to see how sameness of reference, grounded in (irreducibly unique) mental states, can exist on this theory.

Finally, let me turn to Tzohar's textual arguments to support the PMTM thesis. To understand Sthiramati's use of brahminical terminology in his commentary on the Triṃś, Tzohar traces the use of the Sanskrit term upacāra through a number of prior texts. His conclusion is that Sthiramati "reduces the notion of metaphor to its bare minimum, understanding it in terms of its underlying referential mechanism" (161). Tzohar argues this mechanism achieves secondary or figurative reference when primary referents are absent. The idea is that, on the Yogācāra Buddhist view, we seem to experience the world as constituted of objects that are independent of our selves. This self-object duality, though, is illusory, and there is some sense (subject to significant interpretive controversy) in which the world of experience is not independent of our consciousness. (Tzohar largely brackets the usual controversy about Yogācāra idealism to focus on other issues.) Vasubandhu sets out this view in the famous opening lines of the Triṃś, in which he says, as translated by Tzohar (Vasubandhu's text in quotes, Sthiramati's commentary in italicized bold)

"The metaphor (upacāra) of 'things' (dharmāḥ) and of 'self' in its various forms, which is set in motion," that is to say in the world and in treatises, "that is [with
reference to] the transformation of consciousness" (157).[1]

Sthiramati explains what upacāra means in his subsequent commentary. On Tzohar's interpretation of Sthiramati, upacāra is primarily about reference failure, and Sthiramati's Vasubandhu is making claims about our use of words like "things" and "self" in every day discourse. Since there is no genuine referent of "self," its meaning, and all word-meanings, should be sought in the transformation of consciousness (vijñānapariṇāma), a Yogācāra technical term which refers to the psychological causal processes underlying cognition.

The three sources to which Tzohar appeals for this idea that upacāra is centrally about reference failure are early Nyāya and Mīmāṃsā texts, and Bhartṛhari's Vākyapadīya. The clearest positive Nyāya definition of upacāra is given not in the section Tzohar cites (NS 2.2.62ff), which is primarily negative dialectics with Mīmāṃsakas and Buddhists, but at 1.2.14. There, in his bhāṣya, Vatsyāyana defines upacāra as meaning whose basis includes factors such as association. His example is a metonymy, when someone says "The stands are shouting" to mean "The people on the stands are shouting." He defines upacāra as when a word ("stands") refers to something (people), which does not have the nature of the primary referent (stands).[2] Uddyotakara comments that upacāra's trigger is that platforms, being constructions of wood, cannot perform the activity of shouting.[3] The relevance for Tzohar's account is that here, upacāra is (1) not restricted to metaphor, and (2) it is triggered by some kind of sentence-internal semantic incoherence.

In addition, in Mīmāṃsā, we do not find appeal to "absent reference" as the primary mechanism for upacāra. In the Śābarabhāṣya (Śabara's Commentary on the Aphorisms of Vedic Exegesis, the Mīmāṃsāsūtra), an early Mīmāṃsā text, the emphasis is also on semantic incoherence. For instance, in the case of metaphor, gauṇavṛtti (Śabara rarely uses the term upacāra, unlike Naiyāyikas), the emphasis is not on absent reference, but on what we might call a "category mistake." In the sentence discussed at Mīmāṃsasūtra 1.4.22, "The grass-bundle is the ritual patron" (yajamānaḥ prastaraḥ), both subject and predicate are present in the Vedic ritual context. Śabara's opponent wonders how this can intelligibly be taken literally. After all, the inanimate grass-bundle can't act as a human ritual patron! Śabara's response is that they share certain properties (here, centrality to the ritual). And likewise, in a case where Śabara does use upacāra, at MS 6.1.5, he says that since animals cannot own property, we should take expressions like "village of elephants" to be mere figures (upacāramātra). For both Naiyāyikas and Mīmāṃsakas, then, secondary meaning involves some awareness of a semantic incongruence -- a feature that is lacking in Sthiramati, since on his view, ordinary speakers are not aware that words like "umbrella" refer to the transformation of consciousness.

Perhaps referential absence is to be found in Bhartṛhari, who, in many ways, is closer to Buddhists (for which see Herzberger 1986). Tzohar argues that Bhartṛhari aims to explain a "correspondence relation" without "ontological objective ground" (47), unlike Mīmāṃsakas and Naiyāyikas, whose theories of meaning are embedded in realist ontologies. In Bhartṛhari, Tzohar finds a theory of meaning that is independent of ontology and is a "sophisticated contextualist and success-governed account" (47). And Tzohar argues that "Sthiramati's account of metaphor owes much to Bharthari's [sic] discussion of the issue" (155). By this we might think that Sthiramati's "pan-metaphorical theory" is something like Bhartṛhari's emphasis on superimposition (adhyāropa, adhyāsa) in linguistic reference. On this understanding of Bhartṛhari's view (which is famously difficult to pin down), words refer to mental constructs (vikalpas) and all language use is a matter of superimposing a word onto such a hypothetical construction.

Tzohar briefly raises and then dismisses this connection (68, 160-61), saying that in Sthiramati, upacāra is not "glossed as adhyāsa or adhyāropa," though he admits that Sthiramati uses adhyāropa to refer to the superimposition of an object onto the transformation of consciousness (and later, Helārāja does gloss upacāra this way in commenting on Bhartṛhari). However, from the examples that Sthiramati uses in his explication of Vasubandhu's first verse, we could equally read upacāra as "superimposition." For instance, Tzohar translates as follows:

Hence, the metaphor (upacāra) of things such as matter, etc., and the metaphor of self, etc., having its base in the appearance of matter, etc., and the appearance of self, etc., which due to a mental construction [appear] as if they were external, occurs from time immemorial, even without an external self and things, like in the case of the metaphor (upacāra) of net-like apparitions experienced by a person suffering from an eye-disease. And that which is not existent there [in the locus of reference] is figuratively designated (upacaryate) like when one calls the Bāhīka person an ox (158).

However, if we understand upacāra as a cognitive superimposition, then we are not dealing with a linguistic metaphor involving the word "matter" or "self," but a cognitive mistake, superimposing the concept of matter or self (which involve duality) onto the activity of an experiential stream of consciousness. This interpretation, further, avoids the strangeness of calling a visual misperception (seeing net-like floaters in the eye) a "metaphor," when it is in fact a mental superimposition of something unreal onto our visual field. Then the parallel with the Bāhīka person emphasizes the underlying cognitive superimposition thought to be involved in metaphor. (As Tzohar rightly emphasizes, "The Bāhīka is an ox" is a common brahminical example of linguistic metaphor. But explaining it by superimposition would be a Bhartṛharian and not a Mīmāṃsā or Nyāya view of metaphor.) So, the text would instead read (changes in bold):

Hence, the superimposition (upacāra) of things such as matter, etc., and the superimposition of self, etc., having its base in the appearance of matter, etc., and the appearance of self, etc., which due to a mental construction [appear] as if they were external, occurs from time immemorial, even without an external self and things, like in the case of the superimposition (upacāra) of net-like apparitions experienced by a person suffering from an eye-disease. And that which is not there is superimposed (upacaryate) like the ox is superimposed onto the Bāhīka.[4]

Understood in this way, Sthiramati's focus is broader than a theory of metaphor or a theory of (linguistic) meaning. Whether the ox is present or not isn't the focus (after all, the net-like apparitions are certainly present as apparitions). Instead, the emphasis is on the cognitive, not linguistic, superimposition of oxness onto the Bāhīka. Thus, Sthiramati is giving an account of the cognitive processes that he takes to underlie all intentionality (which would include language, but not be limited to it).

I have focused on some reasons to be skeptical that Sthiramati has a theory of metaphor (or figuration or language) and whether Tzohar's version of such a theory is intelligible. A more promising line of inquiry might be how Sthiramati, drawing on Bhartṛhari, is understanding cognitive superimposition more broadly. On this view, when Tzohar puzzlingly says that Sthiramati has a "broadly conceived theory of meaning that is not merely linguistic, but also perceptual," we can resolve the strangeness of a "perceptual theory of meaning" by replacing "meaning" with "intentionality" (204).

Despite the above worries about Tzohar's project, his book takes on a significant task. While it falls short in some ways, it succeeds in demonstrating the importance of that project, and I hope it will encourage further intertextual work that treats Buddhist and brahminical philosophy together.


Thanks to Jay Garfield, Matthew Dasti, and Stephen Phillips for helpful comments on this review.


Nyāyadarśanam with Vātsyāyana's Bhāṣya, Uddyotakara's Vārttika, Vācaspati Miśra's Tātparyaṭīkā and Viśvanātha's Vṛtti. (1985). Eds. Taranatha Nyaya-Tarkatirtha and Amarendramohan Tarkatirtha. 2nd Edition. Calcutta: Munshiram Manoharlal.

Ben-Menahem, Y. (2005). Putnam on Skepticism. In Y. Ben-Menahem, Hilary Putnam (pp. 125-155). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Gold, J. (2007). Yogācāra Strategies against Realism: Appearances (Ākṛti) and Metaphors (Upacāra)". Religion Compass, 131-147.

Herzberger, R. (1986). Bhartṛhari and the Buddhists: An Essay in the Development of Fifth and Sixth Century Indian Thought. Dordrecht: D. Reidel.

Keating, M. (2013). The Cow is to be Tied Up: Sort-Shifting in Classical Indian Philosophy. History of Philosophy Quarterly, 30(4), 311-332.

[1] ātmadharmopacāro hi vividho yaḥ pravartate | lokaśāstrayor iti vākyaśeṣaḥ | vijñānapariṇāme 'sau (Tzohar 157).

[2] upacāro nītārthaḥ sahacaraṇādinimittena atadbhave tadvadabhidnānam upacāra iti (Nyaya-Tarkatirtha and Tarkatirtha 318).

[3] mañcā iti kāṣṭhasaṃghāteṣu pradhāno mañcāśabdaḥ kośanakriyāyā asaṃbhavamīkṣitvā sthāniṣu puruṣeṣu bhāktaḥ (Nyaya-Tarkatirtha and Tarkatirtha 319).

[4] tam ātmādinirbhāsaṃ rūpādinirbhāsañ ca tasmād vikalpād bahirbhūtam ivopādāyātmādyupacāro rūpādidharmopacāraś cānādikālikaḥ pravartate vināpi bāhyenātmanā dharmaiś ca | tad yathā taimirikasya keśoṇḍukādyupacāra iti | yac ca yatra nāsti tat tatropacaryate | tad yathā bāhīke gauḥ. (Tzohar, fn.7, p. 159). This translation also avoids two parenthetical insertions: "[in the locus of reference]" and "like [when one calls] the Bāhīka person an ox." The ox (gauḥ) is superimposed (upacaryate, implicit parallel from the previous sentence) onto (bāhīke in the locative) the Bāhīka person.