Platonist Philosophy 80 BC to AD 250: An Introduction and Collection of Sources in Translation

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George Boys-Stones, Platonist Philosophy 80 BC to AD 250: An Introduction and Collection of Sources in Translation, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 648 pp., $180.00, ISBN 9780521838580.

Reviewed by John Dillon, Trinity College Dublin


This mighty tome is the second in a new series of source-books in post-Hellenistic philosophy, the first having been a similar work on Peripatetic Philosophy (2010) by the late (and much-lamented) Robert Sharples, and it is a worthy companion to that book. Boys-Stones has here chosen to cover what is generally termed the 'Middle Platonic' period, stopping short of Plotinus and his successors. This, however, provides him with quite enough material to be going on with.

The lay-out takes some getting used to at first, but in fact it serves its purpose very well. Following the introduction, there are twenty chapters in all, each divided into three sections: (1) the presentation of the subject matter; (2) notes and further reading; and (3) texts illustrative of the subject matter. This calls for a certain amount of flicking back and forth on the part of the reader, but it turns out, I think, to be better than having all the material piled in together. The texts are all in English translation, but the author has made the original Greek and Latin texts accessible from his website.

He begins with an Introduction, addressing the general question of the study of Middle Platonism and distinguishing it from the Hellenistic philosophical systems. Here he sets himself against the other great collection of materials on ancient Platonism, the 8-volume work initiated by Heinrich Doerrie, Der Platonismus in der Antike (only now coming to completion under the guidance of Christian Pietsch), in which the main purpose is to emphasise the continuity of the Platonic tradition and minimize individual 'deviations'. Boys-Stones is much more concerned to bring out the range of alternative positions that can arise within the tradition, and I am certainly with him on that.

This is then followed by a pair of preliminary chapters, the first on the subject of 'Plato's Authority and the History of Philosophy' -- a topic on which Boys-Stones has already contributed an important study, Post-Hellenistic Philosophy (2001). It seems to me that he presents a most judicious survey of the various current views about the origins of the renewed dogmatism, arising in the early to mid-first century BCE, that constitutes what is conventionally termed 'Middle Platonism'. I would fully grant that Antiochus emerges as a pretty doubtful initiator of the new movement and was certainly not regarded as such by later Platonists (as witness the dismissive treatment of him by Numenius, for example), but he should not be disregarded completely either; and Eudorus cannot, I think, bear the full weight of becoming a founding father. On all this, Boys-Stones is both balanced and comprehensive.

The other interesting question dealt with here is the origin of a concept of 'ancient wisdom', and along with that, the elevation of Plato himself and also of Pythagoras to the status of infallible authorities, whom one can 'interpret,' but never contradict. This may have begun with Antiochus, but it grew legs, and wings, in the following century or so.

The second chapter, 'Making Sense of the Dialogues', traces the growth of an exegetical tradition, along with a reading order for the dialogues, and the privileging of certain key texts, such as the Alcibiades, the Phaedo, the Timaeus, and ultimately the Parmenides.

With these preliminaries established, we embark on a comprehensive survey of Platonist doctrine, starting with what Boys-Stones terms 'Cosmology' but which the ancients termed 'Physics'. This comprises ten chapters and takes up the bulk of the book (pp. 81-364). These chapters cover every aspect of the make-up of the Platonic universe, intelligible and physical, and are titled:

Ch. 3: Causal Principles for a Non-materialist Cosmology
Ch. 4: The Debate over Matter and the                    
Ch 5: Paradigm Forms
Ch. 6: The Creator God                                            
Ch. 7: Theories of Creation                                      
Ch. 8: World Soul and Nature
Ch. 9: Individual Souls and their Faculties
Ch. 10: Living Beings: Gods, Daemons, Humans, Animals, Plants
Ch. 11: Providence
Ch. 12: Fate

As will be seen, this is a thoroughly comprehensive survey of all the main topics of Platonist 'physics', and the compass of such a review as this does not allow of taking up individual issues in any detail. Happily, this is not required, as Boys-Stones presents in each case a thoroughly balanced survey of all of them, with copious reference to all the major authorities, ancient and modern, on each side of a given question.

For example, in the case of the Forms, he discusses, with copious reference to all points of view, the vexed question of when they began to be regarded as the thoughts of God, and also whether they are to be regarded as internal or external, prior or posterior, to the Demiurge. One of the latest views is the most intriguing, that of Longinus, which seeks to assimilate the Forms to Stoic lekta, vis-à-vis the demiurgic intellect. Boys-Stones is not as definite as I would be about tracing the whole theory all the way back to Xenocrates in the Old Academy, but he entertains the possibility.

Boys-Stones' view of the World Soul (Ch. 8) is also notable. He sees it essentially as a 'distributory mechanism' for the Forms, "engendered in matter as a necessary first step towards its imitation of the forms, and as something that is instantiated in heaven" (p. 218); and he provides ample references in support of this. His account of the variety of Platonist doctrines on the individual soul, on daemons, and on providence and fate is replete with well-balanced insights and an excellent choice of texts. He well brings out, for example (pp. 347-50), the difficulties faced by Platonists seeking to preserve some measure of autonomy or free will in the face of the challenge posed by Stoic determinism -- without suggesting that they succeed!

The sections on Dialectic and Ethics are somewhat shorter, but no less comprehensive. 'Dialectic' comprises four chapters: first, two more general ones, on Epistemology (13) and Logic (14), then a separate study of the Middle Platonic treatment of Aristotle's Categories (15), and one on 'The Hierarchy of Sciences' (16). All are most useful, but I particularly appreciated his discussion in 13 of the various approaches (in such authorities as Alcinous, the Anonymous Commentator on the Theaetetus, Plutarch and Numenius) to the question of the relation between the acquisition of 'natural concepts' (physikai ennoiai) from sense-perception and the 'recollection' of the Forms. It seems to me that this all starts with Antiochus of Ascalon, engaged as he was with Stoic philosophy, and takes various turns after that. 'Recollection' of the Forms is all very well, but there also needs to be in the embodied mind some faculty that can process 'raw' sense-data and establish patterns and similarities and thus generate 'natural concepts', even if the Forms are there in the background (as they are not for the Stoics).

The polemic surrounding Aristotle's Categories is indeed a fascinating issue, and Boys-Stones gives a good account of it. One significant development which he discusses is the conclusion, which may go back to Eudorus, that the subject of the Categories is not words, but things: the work is a treatise about ontology, and as such it is inadequate and incomplete. Boys-Stones gives an excellent account of the ramifications of this.

The section on Ethics comprises three chapters, 'The Goal of Virtue and the Ideal Life (17); Ethical Virtue and the Management of the Passions (18); and 'Politics' (19). Between them they cover all the salient issues of this branch of philosophy in the Platonist tradition. I note discussions of the telos (the progression from the Stoicisng 'end' of 'concordance with Nature' to that of 'assimilation to God' derived from Tht. 176a-b), levels of 'good', oikeiōsis or 'appropriation', how to address the passions (viz. apatheia versus metriopatheia), and the role of the philosopher in politics (a question of particular interest to Plutarch).

The volume is rounded off by a most interesting chapter on 'The System of the Chaldaean Oracles' -- the only aspect of what I have termed 'the underworld of Middle Platonism' which Boys-Stones deems it proper to include, setting aside such phenomena as Gnosticism and Hermeticism. His remarks here on the nature of the Chaldaean First Intellect and its affinities to the system of Numenius are much to the point.

The body of the book is followed by a Glossary of basic terms, both Greek and English; a most capacious Bibliography (in which I am embarrassed to note that I take up nearly 4 pages); a Catalogue of Platonists (embracing a multitude of thoroughly obscure figures as well as the main ones); and indices of sources quoted and names.

All in all, this is a magnificent achievement which will serve as the definitive source-book for the period in English for a long time to come.