Abductive Reasoning

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Douglas Walton, Abductive Reasoning, University of Alabama Press, 2004, 303pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 0817314415.

Reviewed by Jason Grossman, Australian National University


Douglas Walton's Abductive Reasoning presents both an introduction to abductive reasoning (including inference to the best explanation) and an interesting and critical assessment of the most important parts of the literature, leading to Walton's own normative theory of abduction and his advice on how we should approach a number of unsolved problems.

As a review of the literature, this book is excellent, citing not only the most important standard works on its topic but also some generally overlooked sections of the literature. In addition, this book contains many excellent insights. Moreover, it is written in a pleasant style. It is, however, a little wordy, and thus does not tell us as much about its topic as one might expect from a 303-page book. As an example of what I mean by wordiness: immediately following an already very full discussion of Polya's description of a reverse modus ponens, we read:

Polya's remarks on this subject are very interesting in regard to the subject of the analysis of abductive reasoning. They are especially interesting in light of Peirce's theory (or at least Fann's version of it) that the logical form of abductive reasoning is a kind of reverse modus ponens inference just like the heuristic inference described by Polya above. A number of questions are raised. Does abductive reasoning of the kind described by Polya occur commonly in mathematical research in the way Polya outlined? And if the kind of mathematical reasoning described by Polya can properly be classified as abductive, can his representation of it as a kind of reverse modus ponens form of argument (the heuristic above) be taken generally to represent the form of abductive inference as an identifiable kind of plausible reasoning? These are large questions, and without some better account of abduction than we presently have, there does not seem to be any way to answer them. (p.16)

The first of those questions is never answered. The second question was already asked on the previous page and will be asked again before the current page is out. In terms of content this is fine, but I would have preferred it if, instead of the whole paragraph quoted above, I had only had to read:

We do not yet have an account which can tell us whether Polya's heuristic can be used to describe abduction.

I have only one other complaint worth mentioning. Walton mixes up -- in the literal sense, and I think also in the intellectual sense -- two vitally different possible meanings of "best" in "inference to the best explanation". One possible meaning is most explanatory; the other is most plausible. The following two cases (for example) are both presented as inferences to the best explanation without any mention of this important difference between them. Firstly, sometimes "best" means most explanatory:


D is a collection of data.

H explains D.

No other hypothesis can explain D as well as H does.

Therefore H is probably true. (p.20, paraphrasing Josephson and Josephson p.14)

Here, we are not meant to wonder whether H is plausible; only whether it is explanatory.

A side issue here -- but a major one, I'm afraid -- is that this scheme falls to an obvious objection: that the hypothesis H' that an omnipotent demon caused D is always at least as explanatory as any other hypothesis; hence, we must require at least some degree of plausibility of H. It seems to me that Walton's own preferred definition of abductive inference falls prey to just this objection. His definition is in two parts, both of which are subject to the demon objection if either is. I quote just one of them, for brevity:


D is a set of data or supposed facts in a case.

Each one of a set of accounts A1,A2, … ,An is successful in explaining D.

Ai is the account that explains D most successfully.

Therefore Ai is the most plausible hypothesis in the case. (p.218)

To return to the ambiguity issue: secondly, sometimes "best" means most plausible:


The fact that before a robbery a had no money, but after had a large sum, is offered to indicate that he by robbery became possessed of the large sum of money. There are several other possible explanations -- the receipt of a legacy, the payment of a debt, the winning of a gambling game, and the like. Nevertheless, the desired explanation rises, among other explanations, to a fair degree of plausibility, and the evidence is received. (p.25, quoting from Wigmore, p.420)

Here, all the explanations mentioned are equally good in the explanatory sense. The robbery explanation is preferred only because it is most plausible (given that there was a robbery).

Failure to mark this distinction is particularly disappointing given that previous literature such as Lipton's book on inference to the best explanation, is careful to do so.

In summary, I cannot recommend this book to generalist philosophers looking for an efficient introduction to abductive inference. It is, however, a very worthwhile read for specialists in inference to the best explanation.


Josephson, John R., and Josephson, Susan G. [1994] Abductive Inference: Computation, Philosophy, Technology. New York: Cambridge University Press.

Lipton, Peter. [2004] Inference to the Best Explanation. 2nd edition. London: Routledge. Reviewed in this journal at http://ndpr.nd.edu/review.cfm?id=2641.

Wigmore, John H. [1940] A Treatise on the Anglo-American System of Evidence. Volume 1, 3rd edition. Boston: Little, Brown.