Abnormal: Lectures at the College de France, 1974-1975

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Foucault, Michel, Abnormal: Lectures at the Collège de France, 1974-1975, eds. Valerio Marchetti and Antonella Salomoni, trans. Graham Burchell, Picador, 2004, 374pp, $17.00 (pbk), ISBN 0312424051.

Reviewed by Jana Sawicki, Williams College


Abnormal is the second of Foucault's lectures at the Collège de France to appear in this new series of English translations. (The French volume was published by Editions de Seuil/Gallimard in 1999 under the general editorship of Francois Ewald and Allesandro Fontana. Arnold Davidson is the general editor of the series of English translations. The first in the series is Foucault's course in 1975-1976, Society Must Be Defended.) Reading these lectures one is ever mindful of the immense archival labor and the intensity of the discipline that Foucault mustered in his counter-disciplinary work. Here again Foucault exhibits his talent for unearthing startling documents and bringing to life the figures represented in them. While many of the analyses of these documents are more suggestive and exploratory than definitive, they are suggestive enough that they are likely to stimulate further genealogical research. Indeed, this was one of their principle purposes. Furthermore, situated as they are between the publication of Discipline and Punish (February 1975) and History of Sexuality, Volume 1 (October 1976), the lectures deepen our appreciation of the books insofar as they contain more developed analyses of some of their central themes. Foucault expands on themes such as confession, the repressive hypothesis, the medicalization of the family, the emergence of psychiatry, and the sexual pervert. Moreover, the lectures also explore themes and figures that are either less central to or absent from the books--the human monster, incest, cannibalism, witchcraft, possession, and the discovery of "instinct" as pivotal to the emergence of the "abnormal individual." And although the "Foreword" by Ewald and Fontana warns against reading the lectures as "sketches for the books," it is tempting, at the very least, to read them as a preliminary formulations of ideas that would have formed the basis of the unwritten volumes that Foucault, while he was writing the first volume of the history of sexuality, imagined he would write. (A, xiii) Readers who are disappointed that Foucault never wrote the promised volumes on confessions of the flesh, hysteria, the Malthusian couple, and onanism will find that these lectures offer some compensation.

Foucault sets the stage for his inquiry into the emergence of the abnormal individual by offering a diagnosis concerning the contemporary medico-legal power of criminal psychiatry. Beginning with two examples of expert testimony in recent legal cases (1955, 1974), he suggests that criminal psychiatry represents a parody of scientific discourse, a discourse that has established itself in part by introducing a psychological and moral double (or correlate) of the legal subject, namely, the "dangerous" or "abnormal" individual. Thus Foucault reiterates the claim made in Discipline and Punish that penal psychiatry is situated within a rule-governed network of power and knowledge--a historical context characterized by the spread of disciplinary and normalizing techniques. What's new here is his suggestion that the episteme of penal psychiatry is quite distinct from that of some of its sister sciences such as psychopathology, psychology, and psychoanalysis--that its scientific status is even more in question. Perhaps, he implicitly suggests, a bit more historical excavation will topple this pseudo-science altogether? He clearly has little respect for it. Foucault disdainfully refers to such experts as pen-pushing "Ubus"--as part of a tradition of vile and buffoonish sovereigns from Nero to Hitler whose power is not compromised by their ridiculousness. The Ubu-esque, Foucault remarks, underscores "the unavoidability, the inevitability of power, which can function in its full rigor and at the extreme point of its rationality even when in the hands of someone who is effectively discredited." (A,13) In effect, power does not reside in the sovereign or the expert, but in the specific rationalities and regimes of power/knowledge in which each functions. Perhaps it also resides in a lack of critical reflection on the historical conditions in which such forms of authority arose. Foucault's histories of the present are premised on this assumption.

In Abnormal Foucault traces two genealogical lines of descent that culminate in the figure of the abnormal individual--a history of psychiatry and of its increasingly powerful role in medico-legal judgment; and a history of sexuality from the emergence of Christian confessional practices to the nineteenth-century crusades against masturbation in children. The first provides an account of how psychiatry connects up with juridical institutions; the second an account of the enmeshment of psychiatry and the family. What isn't as clear from reading the two published books related to this research is how these two histories intersect with the introduction of the concept of the abnormal or dangerous individual, and how the discovery of instinct facilitates this intersection. For psychiatry, the original function of which was to oversee public hygiene and protect the society from illness, forms of abnormality brought into focus by the spread of disciplinary techniques represented an inexhaustible domain of intervention. If in its early stages psychiatry intervened in legal settings on occasion to assess the degree of madness in rare and monstrous crimes, with the emergence of the abnormal individual in the second half of the nineteenth century, the connection between crime and madness becomes an everyday phenomenon. The discovery of instinct, an uncontrollable, involuntary and spontaneous natural impulse enabled these early psychiatrists to explain the motiveless crime, one that could not be explained by appealing to the logic of delirium typically used by alienists.

At the same time as these changes are occurring on the medico-legal front, abnormality is also being sexualized. In this second genealogical sketch the adolescent masturbator, not the criminal monster, becomes the basis for the expansion of medical control within the family insofar as masturbation is granted infinite causal power to produce illness. Instinct is now used to explain sexual tendencies, an unbounded realm of pleasure, that can easily "escape the heterosexual and exogamous norm." (A, 75) As Foucault puts it: "Pleasure not governed by normal sexuality supports the entire series of abnormal, aberrant, instinctive conducts that are capable of being psychiatrized." (A, 287) Hence childhood sexuality is accorded tremendous potential for pathology, an idea that becomes increasingly important in later nineteenth century psychoanalytic accounts of infantile sexuality as well. In short, Foucault claims that the abnormal individual represents a strategic synthesis of three figures (only two of which receive treatment in these lectures): the monster, the onanist and the incorrigible individual, each of which is the correlate of different sciences and each of which has a distinct history.

Foucault concludes his lectures with an expanded discussion of the 1867 case of the proto-sex offender Charles Jouy, a case that he also discusses in History of Sexuality, Volume 1. Because this case has been the occasion for feminist skepticism about the value of Foucault's history of sexuality, and because it occupies such a central role in Foucault's thinking about sex at this time, I want to conclude with a brief discussion of some questions it raises about whether Foucault's alleged gender-blindness contaminates his enterprise. As readers of that work may recall, Foucault used the Jouy case as an example of the spread of social control over sex as an omnipresent and constant danger. Charles Jouy, a simple-minded farmhand who lived on the margins of the economy and the village society, was reported (by the parents, it turns out) for having secured sexual favors from a little girl in the village whom he had seen "caressing" other boys. Jouy is legally charged then examined by several psychiatric experts who not only conduct a psychiatric examination, but also measure his anatomy for signs of degenerescence. Two of the psychiatrists publish the results of their examination. The experts recommend that Jouy be legally acquitted, but they confine him in an asylum. Foucault highlights the banality of the sexual exchanges that are targeted by this emerging science of abnormality, "the pettiness of it all; the fact that this everyday occurrence in the life of village sexuality, these inconsequential bucolic pleasures, could become … the object not only of a collective intolerance but of a judicial action, a medical intervention, a careful clinical examination, and an entire theoretical elaboration."[1] On the basis of this very condensed account of the Jouy case, feminists have reacted skeptically to what appears to be a gender-blind insensitivity to the real danger that Jouy's pleasures may have posed to the young girl in the story. Were these sexual exchanges really inconsequential, petty, let alone pleasurable for the young girl in the story? Might we as feminists not applaud the effort to begin to regulate such pleasures, to explore their enmeshment with domination?[2]

The expanded treatment of this case in Abnormal is more likely to fuel the flames of this controversy then douse them. On the one hand, the discussion in Abnormal is helpful insofar as it emphasizes the historical transformation from a criminal psychiatry oriented toward identifying a psychological illness, a pathological interlude, to one oriented toward identifying a permanent, congenital condition of abnormality, an arrested development marked by an inability to control his sexual tendencies. Jouy's deformed anatomy signifies a permanently deformed sexual instinct.. Thus in him we see combined the figure of the monster, the onanist, and the incorrigible individual. Moreover, the fact that it is the parents of the little girl who report the incident (the mother finds evidence of foul play while doing her daughter's laundry) is important insofar as Foucault is documenting the emergence of the medicalization of the family.

On the other hand, the more Foucault says about the details of the case, the more disturbing evidence one finds of gender-bias in his reading of the case. As it turns out, there were two incidents with Jouy and the girl, Sophie Adams, not one. The first is the exchange of money for masturbation in the company of a second girl who refuses an offer to do the same. After this incident the girl reportedly boasts about it to a peasant leaving the fields. The second Foucault recounts as follows:

[O]nly a bit later, the day of the festival, Jouy dragged young Sophie Adams (unless it was Sophie Adam who dragged Charles Jouy) into the ditch alongside the road to Nancy. There, something happened: almost rape, perhaps. Anyway, Jouy very decently gives four sous to the little girl who immediately runs to the fair to buy some roasted almonds." (A, 293)

Foucault cites the experts to confirm that the exchange of money by adolescent boys for sexual favors from girls was a regular feature of the social landscape in the village at this time. Jouy was a man of forty, but one whom adult women couldn't take seriously. Foucault concludes: "We have here a village infantile sexuality of the open air, the side of the road, and the undergrowth that legal medicine is cheerfully psychiatrizing." (A, 295) Interestingly, Foucault notes that the villagers also recommend that Sophie be sent to a house of correction for her "bad tendencies." (A, 295)

Foucault's own tendency to dismiss the incidents as "inconsequential" coupled with his repeated suggestions that perhaps Jouy was the victim of Sophie, that her previous sexual liaisons with adolescent boys on the edge of the fields, and that the fact that she appeared not to mind (after all, she didn't tell anyone about the alleged rape) might explain--even justify--the incident smacks of masculinist incredulity about the seriousness and reality of rape. It's troubling that Foucault suppresses the second incident in his reference to the case in History of Sexuality, Volume 1 since doing so stacks the deck in favor of his claim that these bucolic pleasures were indeed inconsequential. Sure, it's possible that Sophie was not raped, that she was instead merely prostituting herself. But it's also possible that she was raped. And if we are inclined to be just as disturbed about that, might we be more inclined to think that some sort of intervention would have been appropriate?

Should we conclude from this insensitivity that Foucault regards these bucolic pleasures as genuinely innocent? Is exposing the mechanisms and strategies of this new form of power/knowledge tantamount to claiming that the sexual lives of adolescents were fine before such protective and corrective measures were introduced? That neither Sophie Adams nor Jouy needed protection, correction, or guidance? That Jouy was harmless? Foucault's rhetoric suggests that he might be inclined to say yes. Is it possible that with more feminist sensitivity he would have been more inclined to say what I wish he had said either, "It's not entirely clear," or nothing at all about the banality of moment before Jouy is rendered pathological? The genealogical function of this case is to highlight a transformation in the discursive practices concerning abnormality, a transformation that marks the emergence of an intensification of the interest in infantile sexuality and abnormal sexual tendencies and of policing sexually dangerous behavior. Foucault is in effect historicizing our present practice of being preoccupied with the psycho-sexual development of children. To appeal to present concerns about Sophie's choices, about the effect on her sexual and personal development of exchanging sexual caresses for money, even being raped, would be to beg one of the questions Foucault is raising. Perhaps these bucolic pleasures were more pleasurable, or at least less damaging, before they became the intense focus of this particular normalizing power/knowledge. Yet Foucault doesn't feel compelled to address Sophie's fate at all. Jouy is the victim in his story. And this failure to address her fate, coupled with his suspicion that Sophie was in some sense not even rapeable, undermines the critical effect of his own discourse on abnormality.

After all, the point of genealogy is not to endorse the past, but to interrogate the present. Abnormal does make a compelling case that practices of confinement, medico-legal judgment, and sexual normalization have been constituted within struggles for scientific power and control that are not self-evidently progressive, but it also reminds us at points of the need for a genealogy of the genealogist.

[1] The History of Sexuality: An Introduction, Volume 1, trans. Robert Hurley (New York: Pantheon, 1978), 31.

[2] See especially Linda Alcoff, "Dangerous Pleasures: Foucault and the Politics of Pedophilia," in Feminist Interpretations of Michel Foucault, ed. Susan Hekman (Penn State Press, 1996), 99-135.