Abortion Rights: For and Against

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Kate Greasley and Christopher Kaczor, Abortion Rights: For and Against, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 260pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781316621851.

Reviewed by M. T. Lu, University of St. Thomas (Minnesota)


The editorial front matter in this volume claims that the book "gives readers a window into how moral philosophers argue about the contention issue of abortion rights." As a descriptive claim this strikes me as largely true. Unfortunately, how many "moral philosophers" actually do argue about this issue is not how they should.

The book consists of two essays written (apparently independently) by Kate Greasley (pro-abortion) and by Christopher Kaczor (anti-abortion), followed by a response from each author to the other, and finally a short reply to each response. Greasley begins the central argumentative part of her essay in favor of abortion rights by conceding what she calls the "silver bullet," namely that "if the fetus is a person, equivalent in value to a born human being, then abortion is almost always morally wrong and legal abortion permissions almost entirely unjustified" (5). In other words, she identifies moral personhood as the gravamen of the abortion question, setting aside (without argument) so-called women's rights arguments (of the sort made famous by Judith Jarvis Thomson) that abortion can still be justified even if the unborn child is a person.

This concession makes it immediately clear that her essay is not intended to be any kind of synopsis of the pro-choice side of the abortion debate, but to advance what Greasley herself takes to be the strongest case for the non-personhood of the unborn child. This is significant because many pro-choice writers take women's rights style arguments to be more effective, both because they prescind from many of the difficult questions about the nature of the child, but also because they purport to establish the moral permissibility of abortion even if the unborn child is a person. To concede this point, then, is to give up a lot of ground pro-choice writers have long coveted and so must presumably express Greasley's confidence in her own capacity to establish the non-personhood of the fetus.

Unfortunately, anyone expecting some kind of a new argument (much less one likely to change the mind of anyone already familiar with the abortion literature) will be disappointed. Greasley's argumentative strategy is well-worn. She defends a version of the familiar "developmental view" largely drawn from Mary Anne Warren which "takes personhood or moral status to supervene on developmentally acquired capacities, most notably psychological capacities such as consciousness, ability to reason, communication, independent agency, and the ability to form conscious desires" (26). While such traits may not all be necessary for personhood, Greasley concurs with Warren that "a creature could not lack all of the traits and yet be a person" (26).

She proposes that the non-personhood of the fetus can be established by means of three thought experiments, one of which -- the "embryo rescue case" (ERC) -- she seems to think is nearly dispositive. This is something like a trolley scenario in which we are invited to choose between rescuing "five frozen human embryos" or "one fully formed human baby" from a burning building. Greasley holds that it would be "unthinkable" to rescue the embryos "despite the fact that the embryos number five and the baby only one" (27). This she takes to be deeply problematic for anyone holding the standard pro-life view that the embryos are "morally considerable persons." Ultimately, she thinks this shows that "people simply do not believe that death is as serious for the embryo, or as tragic from an impartial point of view, as infant death or the death of an adult human being" (30). Accordingly, "the [intuitive] pull to save the baby . . . rather than the embryos -- even though this would mean saving the one over the many -- tells us something meaningful about our view of the relative status of embryos and born human beings" (31, emphasis in original).

Greasley's thought here is straightforward: if people would save one infant over five embryos, then they simply cannot believe that those embryos are "morally considerable persons." Of course, even if this is what the respondents believe, that doesn't by itself show that the belief is true. To be fair, Greasley does somewhat concede this point, noting that historically many have (falsely) denied the moral status of certain groups. Nonetheless, she largely dismisses the possibility that this is just a mistaken belief and seems to think the only truly plausible explanation for the near universal intuition is a (warranted) belief that the infant is a person and the embryos are not.

I do not have much confidence in the philosophical helpfulness of these sorts of cases in general, but if we are forced to play this game some reflection will show that the ERC doesn't have nearly the force Greasley want to gives it. Consider a parallel case in which we have to choose between saving five fully conscious nonagenarians and one baby. Perhaps I am unusual, but my intuitions are almost entirely in favor of the baby, "even though this would mean saving the one over the many." This is obviously not because I think the elderly are not persons. In fact, forced to choose, I wouldn't hesitate much between saving, say, one mother with small children over five childless, middle-aged tenured philosophy professors. Again, this is not because I deny the personhood of my colleagues (certain faculty meetings notwithstanding), but for the simple reason that I genuinely believe that it would very likely be worse for several small children to lose their mother than for five childless adults to die tragically (though, of course, there are possible circumstances that might cause me to reconsider). In short, a decided preference for one over many does not by itself entail, or even strongly suggest, a clear denial of the personhood of the many.

In the end, though, the larger problem with Greasley's approach is not merely competing intuitions. The personhood question really cannot be convincingly settled by this sort of intuition pumping. Indeed, it is precisely the intractability of the personhood question that leads so many pro-choice writers to embrace a women's right approach that putatively allows them to prescind from the question.

To her credit, after presenting her thought experiments Greasley does at least make some effort to engage personhood arguments. However, she is unsuccessful because her criticisms make clear that she doesn't really understand what she is criticizing. While there are a number of approaches to arguing for the personhood of the unborn child (and both authors discuss Don Marquis' famous "future like ours" argument at length) the key one here is Christopher Kaczor's "Personhood as Endowment" argument.

Kaczor begins by distinguishing a "functional" view of personhood from his "endowment" (or sometimes "substance") view. The functional view (of which Warren's and Greasley's accounts are examples) makes personhood dependent on the occurrent exercise of certain (especially rational) powers. By contrast, on the endowment view "it is sufficient for moral status to be capable of sentience or capable of rational functioning. An appeal is made here not to actual functioning but to the kind of thing the being is, the kind of being capable of sentience or rational functioning" (135). So, what matters for the personhood of the unborn child (or anyone else, such as a sleeping adult) is not whether that individual is currently exercising or demonstrating the powers characteristic of a person, but whether that individual is the kind of being that is rational (or sentient, etc.) by nature.

On this view, any and all human beings, from conception onwards, are rational creatures. If all rational creatures (human or otherwise) are persons, then all human beings are persons. As Kaczor puts it, the "substance view rests on the claim that each and every human being (born and unborn) actually (not just potentially) possesses a rational nature, and therefore merits fundamental respect as a rational being" (135-6, emphasis added).

That Greasley misunderstands the view is clear from her attempt to criticize it. She claims that "if we award [the young] equal moral status, this can only be on the basis of their potential to exercise those capacities in the future" (50, emphasis added). In short, they have a right to life not because they are actual persons, but because "they are at least potential persons in that they are individual human organisms that will, if they survive and develop, eventually become persons" (50). However, she notes that this "potentiality principles suffers . . . from an obvious logical problem . . . [that] there is no reason why being a potential person ought to endow a creature with the very same rights as an actual person" (51). Given that obvious problem, one would think Greasley should give more thought to why pro-life writers, Kaczor included, have continued to insist on the point.

In his initial response, Kaczor notes that he has "never encountered a single scholar who defends the view that the prenatal human being has a right to live because he or she is a potential person . . . The classic pro-life view is not that the prenatal human being is a potential person, but rather that the prenatal human being is a person with potential" (196). Unfortunately, after saying this, he does not go on to explain what it means or why exactly, which is the greatest defect in his part of the book.

In fact, the substance view is rooted in Aristotle's philosophy of nature. While contemporary neo-Aristotelians and Thomists have developed the view considerably, the relevant issue here is that any (putative) potential must belong to a substance with a particular nature. To say that a particular substance has a potential to develop in some way is not to make a prediction about the future, but to make a claim about that thing's nature right now. On this view, no non-rational being can ever develop rational powers (de novo) and remain the same thing.[1] Rather, insofar as a rational being begins to exercise those powers at some point in its life it does so precisely because they were always already latent in its nature. To say that a fetus is "potentially rational" is not to say that it will become a rational being when it begins to exercise those powers; it is rather to say that its (latent) rational nature will (likely, but not necessarily) become more fully actualized.[2]

Greasley's putative counterexamples show that she doesn't understand this. She claims that just "as a caterpillar that metamorphoses into a butterfly appears to go through a fundamental and substantial change in nature while remaining the same thing, so it seems true to say of human beings that when the go through a fundamental change in nature as when they become persons, while remaining the same numerical entity" (183). Similarly, she claims her imagined interlocutor "presumably would not agree that dead human bodies are persons . . . even though they are . . . numerically identical with the human being that was alive" (183).

For the substance theorist, neither example makes sense. The caterpillar cannot undergo "a fundamental and substantial change" and yet remain "the same thing" because a substantial change, by definition, involves the destruction of the original thing. The substance theorist would say that the caterpillar has not undergone a substantial change at all (and therefore is numerically identical to the butterfly) but has, well, metamorphosed (i.e., literally, "changed shape"). In Greasley's other case, the substance theorist does not regard a corpse as numerically identical with the human being that was alive, precisely because death is a substantial change.

On this view, the identity of a substance across the actualization of some potency just means that the change in question is not (and cannot be) a substantial change. Instead, such a (developmental) change is the actualization of a latent potency that was always already there in the nature of that substance. This is exactly how a substance theorist understands the human being from conception: as a substance of a rational nature. While the zygote, embryo, fetus, infant, etc. cannot occurrently exercise any rational powers, he or she is a rational creature from the moment of his or her substantial existence. Furthermore, since classical substance theorists hold organisms to be paradigmatic substances, the beginning of the rational substance is identical with the beginning of the organism. Accordingly, the human organism cannot become a person, because that would constitute a substantial change. So, if the being capable of exercising rational powers at some point (say, t + 7 years) is numerically identical with the fetus at t, that just means no substantial change can have occurred between t and t+7.

Of course, this just scratches the surface in articulating the substance view and none of this shows that it is correct. Like any other serious philosophical view, it requires development and defense from a variety of possible objections. My point is simply that Greasley has not raised the right kind of objections, because her criticisms reveal that she's attacking a straw man. As I noted above, however, I also think Kaczor can be legitimately criticized for failing to make clear why this is so. While he often notes Greasley's misunderstandings, he doesn't really show why she's failing to engage the substance view.

Ultimately, this is what I mean when I say the book reflects how "moral philosophers" do argue about abortion, rather than how they should. The kinds of criticisms Greasley offers of potentiality reflect the same kind of misunderstanding of the substance view that Michael Tooley has been offering since the early 70's. There isn't a real dialectic here because Greasley doesn't adequately understand the view she's criticizing and Kaczor hasn't adequately articulated and defended its deeper basis. Greasley's arguments fall flat largely because she's attempting to establish the non-personhood of the unborn child through superficial thought experiments without even grappling with the deeper metaphysical issues at hand. In short, Greasley is talking past Kaczor, not actually identifying and attacking putatively false premises or fallacious reasoning. For Kaczor's part, while I think he does a better job of actually engaging various pro-choice arguments overall, he still leaves much too much unsaid.

In the end, it's not clear what philosophical purpose this book best serves. It does not offer any significantly new arguments (nor do the authors claim otherwise). Neither is it an attempt to summarize the state of the abortion debate, as large parts of that debate are elided or ignored (e.g. the women's rights arguments and the more recent virtue ethics discussions). Even just with regards to the views of the two authors, it's unnecessary in that each of them has a more complete monograph on the subject. I find these sorts of "for and against" books are rarely that successful, and I fear this one will only tend to confirm that judgment.

[1] If Michael Tooley’s famous kitten example (a magic serum that makes a normal kitten into a rational cat) were actually possible, it would constitute a substantial change.

[2] On this view, the claim “human beings are rational” is an example of what Michael Thompson has called an “Aristotelian Categorical.” It is parallel to the claim that “human beings are bipedal” and would not be falsified by adducing an example of a human being born without legs, nor by a normal infant who cannot (yet and may never) walk. Needless to say, much more can and should be said that space does not permit.