About Oneself: De Se Thought and Communication

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Manuel García-Carpintero and Stephan Torre (eds.), About Oneself: De Se Thought and Communication, Oxford University Press, 2016, 348pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198713265.

Reviewed by Léa Salje, University of Leeds


The topic of the de se is old but far from tired. Indeed, it is easy to feel that this is an exciting time for this set of debates. Recent doubts about traditional ways of formulating the central problem, together with a wave of renewed efforts at finding creative ways of developing models equipped to handle not only de se thought but also communication, have prepared the ground for newly defined problems and correspondingly new solutions in an area with a long history. It is in this atmosphere that Manuel García-Carpentiro and Stephan Torre have put together this timely collection of new papers.

I will not attempt a full and systematic review of each of the chapters (though see §4 of Torre's introduction for a helpful overview). In what follows, rather, I limit myself to drawing out some of the central themes that cut across the volume.

The two omnipresent giants in the background are John Perry and David Lewis. Perry (with others) convinced us of the indispensible category of de se thought, or as he calls them, self-locating attitudes. The motivating cases are well-known:

Ernst Mach realizes that he is the shabby pedagogue that he sees in the bus mirror. David Kaplan realizes that his pants are on fire. Winnie-the-Pooh realizes that the tracks he is following are his own rather than a woozle's. John Perry realizes that he is the one spilling sugar all over the supermarket floor. (p.1)

In each case the subject undergoes a doxastic transformation of a kind that leaves the referential profile of his belief intact; what the subject comes to realise is that the object of his belief is -- how else could he put it? -- me. Perry showed thought of this kind to be a problem for traditional theories of attitudinal content, according to which having a propositional attitude consists in a binary relation between a subject and a Fregean truth-value invariant proposition, and offered an alternative two-tiered way of modelling these contents by separating out belief contents from belief states. Lewis, motivated by similar considerations and similar cases, gave us centred possible worlds.

A recurring motif of this volume is that this historically influential case-driven Perry-Lewis understanding of the distinctive problem raised by de se thought no longer holds centre ground -- or at least, that by themselves these cases fail show what is so special or interesting about the de se category of mental and linguistic content. As Robert Stalnaker presses, we don't need to appeal to cases involving ignorance to see the demand for a way of modelling self-locating aspects of belief:

Cases of ignorance about one's place in the world are just one manifestation of the distinctive role of one's perspective on the world, and one can show, without invoking such cases, that a purely impersonal and time-independent representation of an agent's state of belief (at a time) inevitably leaves something out. (p.122)

Dilip Ninan, likewise, argues at some length that skeptics about the de se are right that cases of this kind are nothing but familiar Frege cases illustrating the general opacity of attitudinal contexts, though wrong to think that this means there is no distinctive problem of de se thought. García-Carpentiro goes yet a step further in his claim about the introduction of de se attitudes that 'it was obvious to Casteñada, Chisholm, Lewis, Perry, and Sosa  . . .  well before present-day skeptics  . . .  built their cases on it, the stories motivating their introduction (like Perry's messy shopper) are just [Frege] cases.' (p.186; references removed) None of these authors recommend a slide into skepticism about the philosophical significance of the de se, but we must look elsewhere to see its interest.

So what is the distinctive problem of the de se? The authors of this volume are largely in agreement that the place to look for the answer is not to the isolated cognitive machinations of an individual thinker, but to intersubjective content-transactions or explanations involving de se contents. For Ninan, the pivotal question is how to find a single object that can serve in both of two theoretical roles apparently played by attitudinal contents: the role of agreement, according to which interpersonal agreement consists in convergence on a single content, and the role of explanation, according to which two subjects who share only and all the same attitudes will, ceteris paribus, behave alike. Both are plausible, but their combination creates a special problem for de se contents; 'A problem arises because, given certain features of de se attitudes, the contents of attitudes cannot play both roles.' (p.99) For Isidora Stojanovic, the question is how to model what is said in a way that accommodates linguistic intuitions about when two subjects have said the same thing using duplicate sentences containing a de se component. This de se same-saying data throws up a special problem for what she calls the mainstream view, a view that identifies what's said with a Kaplanian content, because of cases in which 'the Kaplanian contents differ because the referents of the first person pronoun differ, yet we robustly perceive same-saying.' (p.209) Both of these are refined versions of what we might think of as a 'what changes vs. what stays the same?' question about contents involving context-bound constituents in the minds and mouths of different subjects.

For the most part, however, the authors single out the challenge of modelling de se communication as providing the central distinctive problem of the de se. The force of this challenge, as it is presented in a number of the chapters, is taken to derive from the initial plausibility of a particular view of communication, according to which communicative success involves the transfer of a single content from speaker to hearer. This model has many names -- the simple transfer model, the transmission model, the package delivery model, the FedEx model, and the Naïve conception of communication (see p.13, n.32) -- but can be recognised by its commitment, in cases of communicative success, to the existence of a single content that serves as (i) the content of the speaker's original belief, (ii) the content of the speaker's utterance by which she expresses this belief, and (iii) the content of the hearer's belief upon understanding and accepting the speaker's utterance. Against the backdrop of this view of communication we find a special problem for de se contents. That is, there does not seem to be any such single content that could play all three roles in the communication of our de se beliefs. On the face of it, if I express my de se belief that I am hungry with the sentence 'I am hungry', it will be a failed communicative attempt if on that basis you come to form a belief with the very same content, I am hungry. I was trying to tell you that I am hungry, not that you are.

One gets the sense, however, that this way of framing the central problem as composed of the pair of incompatible commitments to the possibility de se communication on the one hand, and to the simple transfer model of communication on the other, is really just for the set-up -- and that the real challenge is at once less sensational and more interesting than this. Most authors are happy to drop allegiance to the simple transfer model early on, in agreement with Torre that 'the phenomenon of de se communication just shows that the Simple Transfer Model is too simple.' (p.15) Indeed, it is pointed out more than once that even if it wasn't for problems for the model associated with de se communication, we still would have reason to think it overly simplistic. Peter Pagin, for instance, writes that 'the idea that sameness of content between speaker and hearer is too strong a necessary condition for communicative success is not new, and is well motivated by considerations outside de se communication.' (p.304) The real question is, once we reject the simple transfer model, what replaces it? How -- if not by positing a single content across the board -- should we model the contents involved in de se communicative exchanges?

The development and refinement of detailed theories responding to this challenge is where we find most of the meat of the volume. François Recanati presents a response in terms of his mental files framework (worked out in detail elsewhere). He urges a distinction between psychological modes of presentation, or ways of thinking of things, which are modelled in his framework as the mental files themselves; and linguistic modes of presentation, or linguistically encoded information about the referent. In a case of de se communication, Recanati argues, the linguistic mode of presentation is the same for all conversational participants; use of the word 'I' straightforwardly encodes the information that the referent is the speaker. There is no asymmetry of access to this linguistic mode of presentation, even if the psychological modes of presentation corresponding to it differ between speaker and hearer. As Recanati explains, 'It follows that communication involves, not replication, but coordination of thoughts.' (p.154) He thus rejects the very presupposition of the simple transfer model that there is such thing as 'the thought' expressed by the speaker's utterance and taken up by the hearer. 'There is no such thing: there is the speaker's thought and the thought formed by the hearer if communication is successful'. (p.154)

Clas Weber likewise proposes a model of de se communication that dispenses with any commitment to uniformity between the speaker and hearer's mental contents. On his centred worlds model a speaker and a hearer share a world, but they do not share a centre within it. This means that in order to make sense of a de se utterance, a hearer must perform an inference that will take her from one content -- that expressed by the speaker -- to a slightly different content -- the one involved in her final state of communicative understanding. The details of this inferential process constitute Weber's recentring model of de se communication. Weber's concluding remarks reinforce the sense that that getting rid of the simple transfer model of communication is a gain to his theory rather than a loss:

Our respective thoughts and assertions represent the world from different perspectives -- every one of us is at the centre of her own beliefs and utterances. This doesn't mean that their content is private and unsharable. But when we exchange our views of the world with each other, we have to take into account our distinct locations within it. (p.269)

In contrast to Weber, Stalnaker argues that 'Ignorance about where one is in the world is always also ignorance about which possible world is actual' (p.123). If this is right, then it follows that 'we can represent the contents of belief, self-locating and otherwise, as ordinary timeless and impersonal propositions.' (p.124) What is communicated in a de se exchange is not a centred content of any kind, but the uncentred timeless and impersonal proposition that is determined by the speaker's centred content together with its relevant points of evaluation. Incidentally, this aspect of Stalnaker's view renders it compatible with the simple transfer model of communication. But it is telling that Stalnaker is shy about placing too much weight on this compatibility as a motivating consideration for his view -- he notes that his view 'does help to give a smooth representation' of communication, but that there 'may be other ways of explaining how we calibrate cognitive states of different people at different times.' (p.136) He also takes pains to stress that the thesis that there is an uncentred content corresponding to every centred content is independently well-motivated. This reluctance to revel too loudly in his view's compatibility with the simple transfer model seems to be part intellectual graciousness and part symptom of the decline of the basic appeal of that model.

This volume has all the hallmarks of issuing from years of conversation between colleagues. A few of the papers fell slightly outside these discussions, and for that reason, together with reasons of space, I have not mentioned them here[1]. At its best, reading this volume feels like overhearing a specialist workshop on the de se. Stalnaker spends his chapter responding to an earlier objection by Weber, and in a particularly enjoyable thread, Recanati responds on Weber's behalf to an objection raised in Pagin's chapter. Dirk Kindermann and Pagin both construct their chapters around a generous landscaping of the area. I found these two chapters extremely helpful in getting a sense of placing for some of the other chapters, and would recommend them as a good place to start.

A note on them, though. This complementing pair of chapters at the end of the volume may leave the reader with a lingering sense that in the final tally, many of these competing possible worlds models end up with largely comparable dimensions of explanatory power in the face of the challenge from de se communication. As Kindermann suggests, this is not to say that there will be no way of deciding between them; only that these decisions will have to be made on grounds other than their capacity to handle de se communication. Yet more rumblings, perhaps, of shifting grounds in the search for a distinctive problem of the de se.

[1] I stress that this is not because they are any less interesting than the chapters I mention. In particular, I urge a reading of Aidan McGlynn's thought-provoking chapter on immunity to error through misidentification.