About the Beginning of the Hermeneutics of the Self: Lectures at Dartmouth College

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Michel Foucault, About the Beginning of the Hermeneutics of the Self: Lectures at Dartmouth College, 1980, Graham Burchell (tr.), University of Chicago Press, 2016, 140pp., $25.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226188546.

Reviewed by Cynthia D. Coe, Central Washington University


The core of this book is a transcript of two lectures -- "Subjectivity and Truth" and "Christianity and Confession" -- given in English by Foucault at Dartmouth College in November 1980, which are revised versions of the Howison lectures given at the University of California-Berkeley in October of the same year (and then published as Subjectivity and Truth). The title comes from Foucault's suggestion during the Berkeley lectures that these two lectures should have had this title (27n). Appended to these lectures are the transcript of a public discussion held at Berkeley two days after the lectures there and the transcript of an interview conducted by Michael Bess in early November 1980. As a whole, then, the texts provide insight into Foucault's thinking about the hermeneutics of the subject in the fall of 1980, particularly as he articulates the role that truth-telling plays in the formation of modern subjectivity and speculates about what might supplant that role.

The main theme of the lectures, the public discussion, and the interview is Foucault's genealogy of the modern subject, which is traced from the centrality of confession as a medieval technique of the self. Foucault enters into this study by recounting the therapeutic technique of the nineteenth-century French psychiatrist François Leuret, who demands, by submitting his patients to cold showers, that they describe their own symptoms of madness and then identify themselves as mad. Foucault emphasizes Leuret's claim that the cure depends on the patient's verbal affirmation of his or her madness -- not merely that his or her delusions be revealed as delusions, as in Don Quixote's battle with the knight of the mirrors. Salvation or psychiatric cure depends on articulating one's cognitive or moral failings to others. That is, truth takes on a performative function: acknowledging certain claims changes who we are. Foucault reads this therapeutic practice as a particular inheritance of the medieval association between confession, self-renunciation, and spiritual cleansing.

Foucault is most interested in how truth functions as a technique of power, regulating and producing particular forms of conduct and self-relation. These lectures thus form part of Foucault's investigations into governmentality, "The contact point, where the individuals are driven by others is tied to the way they conduct themselves" (25-26). Conduct serves as that site where self-regulation and domination intersect, and out of which resistance may emerge. In turning to the lens of government, Foucault acknowledges that his previous work emphasized the element of "domination" embodied in the institutions that separate the normal from the abnormal: hospitals, asylums, and prisons, and that his new interest is in the more complicated intersection of coercion and what he calls "self-technologies," one of which is the practice of vigilant self-examination and confession (26).

As a way of denormalizing the conjunction of truth-telling and salvation, Foucault engages in a genealogical analysis of how the purposes of reflecting upon oneself and then publicizing those reflections have shifted over time -- specifically contrasting the significance of how truth intersects with subjectivation in ancient Hellenistic and medieval Christian practices. One guiding thread in this analysis is the historical variability between ancient interpretations of the Delphic command to know thyself, and modern ones, which hermeneutically try "to find the truth in the depths of the soul" (111). More specifically, Foucault contrasts the ancient practices of self-transformation and the early and medieval Christian practices of exomologesis, public penance that dramatizes one's identity as a sinner, and exagoreusis, analyzing and reporting one's sins to a spiritual mentor or director. Vocalizing the truth comes to be associated with a cleansing and redemptive power, by which the sinful self is renounced and replaced by a virtuous one. Ancient Greek and Roman practices of self-reflection have no such emphasis on purification through confession, under the authority of a hierarchical relation that culminates in God. On Foucault's interpretation of such texts as Seneca's De Ira, the practices of ancient self-reflection focused on the recording of advice from one who has mastered himself and from whom disciples may learn to avoid mistakes, so that self-reflection is less about purification than about allowing one's knowledge of fundamental moral principles to better guide one's action. In this sense these lectures reflect Foucault's late interest in ethics and particularly in the forms of self-relation developed by Stoics, Epicureans, and Cynics.

Foucault ends the pair of lectures by suggesting that modernity has repeatedly attempted to give some "positive foundation" to the self, by which the hermeneutics of the self would be preserved, without being governed by the requirement of ascetic self-sacrifice (76). But he asks whether we need to continue this quest, or whether instead we should develop an alternative to this form of self-constitution. Foucault states very clearly in the discussion following "Truth and Subjectivity" that his problem "was to get rid of this philosophy of the subject" grounded in Descartes (104), who has his own version of internal suspicion and "spiritual self-examination" (105). The process by which we accomplish that rejection is genealogical, by revealing how those techniques have shifted over time, in terms of their purpose and deployment, and are linked to the modern processes of subjectivation. Foucault argues that treating the subject as a puzzle to be deciphered, the hermeneutics of the self, is essentially a Christian form of self-relation, in which self-transformation is deeply linked to exposing one's sins to a moral authority.

Foucault is, characteristically, much more circumspect about what might replace this hermeneutics of the self, in either its negative or positive form. But the contemporary significance of these investigations into the history of the subject is never far from the surface, as the two supplementary texts -- the interview with Bess and the discussion following the Berkeley lecture -- make clear. He begins the interview by declaring that he is "a moralist," in the specific sense that our freedom consists in our ability to reject or resist what governs present reality. His proximity to Nietzsche's genealogical disruption of "fixed ideas" (On the Genealogy of Morals II:3) is particularly clear in his suggestion that we resist "everything that actually aims to immobilize and render sacrosanct what is given to us as real, true, and good" (127). In response to persistent prodding and frustration at the open-endedness of Foucault's ethics, however, Foucault refuses to provide a determinate vision of the good, a temptation that he identifies with intellectuals who have been providing such answers "for two thousand years, with … catastrophic consequences" (137). Refusing this role as a "prophet," he is only willing to say that he is supporting the collective, social work that critically reflects upon the forces that structure the present and imagines other alternatives, and the three activities that make possible such reflection are "refusal, curiosity, and innovation" (136). Foucault significantly enacts those commitments in these texts discussing the hermeneutics of the subject and in his suggestion that we find other ways to understand ourselves.

The Dartmouth lectures certainly differ from the Berkeley lectures, given four weeks previously, and the editors' footnotes extensively and clearly mark those revisions. At various points Foucault has added or deleted whole paragraphs. However, most of Foucault's changes concern how much detail he lends his examples, or how far he follows a line of thinking. In many cases, Foucault has condensed and focused his remarks by deleting material included in the Berkeley lectures. For instance, in the second lecture, entitled "Christianity and Confession," at Berkeley Foucault relates a story from John Cassian, a fourth century theologian, about a young monk who is forbidden by his spiritual master to die and so lives on until he is given permission to die. That example of spiritual obedience is deleted from the Dartmouth lecture. Similarly, a discussion of thoughts as the true target of spiritual discipline -- "a field of subjective data which have to be considered and analyzed as objects" in confession, as opposed to desires or actions -- appears in highly condensed form in the Dartmouth lecture (69). The differences between the Berkeley lectures and the Dartmouth lectures will be of interest to Foucault scholars, but although the Dartmouth lectures are more streamlined in terms of expression, the central ideas have not undergone any significant revision. In addition to the thorough footnotes indicating these differences, extensive endnotes on all four selections put these ideas in the wider context of Foucault's thought and indicate where else he discussed them. In this sense, this text will be most useful for Foucault scholars tracing the details of his later work.

The pieces collected in this book do not add a great deal that is new to the existing discourse on Foucault, given that the Berkeley lectures and the Bess interview have previously been published. In general, however, these lectures certainly indicate the continuities in Foucault's thought from the genealogical analyses of the 1970s, principally Discipline and Punish and The History of Sexuality, with his later studies associated with the care of the self. The publishers of this volume have provided a fluid and carefully annotated transcription of four texts that deepen our understanding of Foucault's idiosyncratic use of ancient ethics and what he thought we might learn from it.