Absolute Generality

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Agustín Rayo and Gabriel Uzquiano (eds.), Absolute Generality, Oxford University Press, 2006, 396pp., $45.00 (pbk), ISBN 0199276439

Reviewed by Graham Priest, University of Melbourne/University of St. Andrews


Rayo and Uzquiano have put together a fine collection of essays on this knotty issue. It would certainly appear that we can quantify over absolutely everything. Yet the assumption that one can do so leads to a number of problems. Unsurprisingly, then, good logicians may disagree on the possibility of such quantification. In this volume, Fine, Glanzberg, Hellman, Lavine, and (Charles) Parsons come down against it; Linnebo, McGee, Rayo, Uzquiano, Weir, and Williamson for it; Shapiro and Wright sit delicately on the fence. The volume starts with a brief introduction by the editors, which nicely sets the scene. As one would expect from a bunch of logicians of this calibre, the essays are insightful, thought provoking, and often technically clever. (Typos are mercifully few, though two footnote 1 markers in Parsons' paper throw all the later footnotes out of kilter.)

Because we can, prima facie, sensibly quantify over absolutely everything ('Everything is self-identical', 'Nothing has every property'), the view that one can so quantify has to be the default view. Those who would deny it must show how to accommodate the things we seem to be able to say, and want to say, using such quantification. Most importantly, we appear to need to employ absolutely universal quantification (hereafter, AUQ) in giving semantics for languages, where we wish to quantify over all interpretations, and mean all. (The union of the domains of all interpretations is all objects.) A particularly painful example of what the denier of AUQ cannot say is the denial itself: 'You can't quantify over absolutely everything'. Quantify over what?

Various strategies to solve these problems of expressivity are articulated by those in the volume who would deny AUQ. Fine proposes the use of a novel kind of modal operator. Versions of contextualism are endorsed by Glanzberg and Parsons. Parsons guardedly endorses a notion of typical ambiguity, and a notion of schematic expression in the same ballpark is urged by Lavine. Hellman tries to deploy the machinery of sortals; and Shapiro and Wright explore the possibilities of the notion of indefinite extensibility.

Clearly, it is impossible to go into details concerning all of these articles here. But, generally speaking, I was not persuaded that the mechanisms proposed will do the required job. In particular, versions of typical ambiguity run foul of familiar problems. In certain kinds of meditation, I am told, meditators have a state where all intentionality disappears, and so they think of nothing. How to express such an assertion? Maybe one can take it to be 'm does not think of x', schematic, in some sense, in x (though I find it hard to understand this as anything other than a universally quantified sentence). But once the proposition is embedded in larger contexts, even this device is unavailable. Consider: 'If m were to think of nothing, then m would attain enlightenment'. This is not the same as a schematic assertion of 'If m were not to think of x, then m would attain enlightenment', which would make enlightenment far too easy!

On the other side of the coin, and again speaking generally, there are three kinds of consideration that mitigate against the possibility of AUQ, the last itself breaking into two.

1. In the context of some natural set theoretic and/or semantic principles such quantification leads to contradictions: variations of Russell's or Grelling's paradox.

2. The indeterminacy of such quantification, due, essentially, to the Löwenheim Skolem Theorem.

3. The notion of all objects is incoherent, because the notion of an object is relative to:

(a) a conceptual scheme;

(b) a sortal.

These arguments are articulated and developed in various ways by those in the volume against AUQ.

Those on the other side are, of course, concerned to rebut them. Linnebo, Rayo, and Weir engage mainly with objection 1, suggesting different ways in which the semantics of a language may be developed consistently within the context of AUQ. Uzquiano is also engaged with a version of 1. McGee and Williamson are concerned with 2, both arguing that "open ended" quantifier rules demonstrate AUQ.

I find argument 3 the least persuasive of the three. This is because we employ universal quantification in places which are trans-(conceptual scheme) and trans-sortal. Thus, we may say that Russell thought of everything. He thought of Cambridge, Whitehead, and the number three, even though these are of different sorts. And he thought of phlogiston, of oxygen, and of the poison oracle, even though these come from different conceptual schemes. 'Anything' can mean anything of any sort, and of any conceptual scheme.

Objection 2 is tougher. But one should remind oneself that even though a theory has non-standard models, there may still be a privileged model. There are non-standard models of first-order arithmetic, but it is an act of implausible skepticism to suppose that when one talks of natural numbers one might be talking about the objects in one of these. Similarly with the quantifiers and their interpretation. (The fact that the domain of quantification is always contextually determined is irrelevant. The point is whether there can be contexts in which the quantifiers range over everything.) The question of what it is in virtue of which we engage a particular interpretation of course remains. Those familiar with the debates around "Putnam's model-theoretic argument" will know some of the ins and outs of this kind of issue. I find the McGee/Williamson line on this matter persuasive. If one is prepared to instantiate a universal quantifier with any noun-phrase one has, or could ever come up with, this would seem to take the quantifier beyond any domain that is less than universal. (Just choose a name for something not in such a domain.)

It is objection 1, it seems to me, that is the toughest objection, as the amount of ink that is spilled on it in the volume indicates. As Lavine puts it (p. 101), '[a]ttempts to rescue unrestricted quantification from the paradoxes all involve imposing limitations on what seem to be intuitively evident principles, or at least extremely plausible ones, in itself a substantial cost …'. The solutions proposed by Linnebo, Rayo, and Weir all have their problems. Linnebo and Rayo work within some version of classical logic, and end up advocating hierarchies of some kind (of properties, or higher order quantifiers). The semantics of one stage of the hierarchy is given at the next stage. But the semantics of the hierarchy as a whole still cannot be given. Weir endorses a non-classical logic, which allows him to endorse the naive comprehension schema of set theory. But his desire for consistency eventually forces him, too, to admit that a hierarchy of metalanguages is unavoidable. This is all unsurprising. The contradictions to be avoided are, as the authors are well aware, all versions of standard paradoxes of self-reference. So an insistence on consistency is liable to force this kind of move sooner or later. (See G. Priest, In Contradiction (Oxford University Press, 2006), 1.7 and 2.5.)

The correct solution here is, I think, a dialetheic one. One of the great strengths of dialetheism is its ability simply to absorb certain contradictions; and, in particular, to provide a simple way of allowing a theory to specify its own semantics. (See In Contradiction, ch. 9 and 19.12.) Nor is this ad hoc. Since the contradictions that arise are simple variations of standard paradoxes of self-reference, they all fit the Inclosure Scheme. (See G. Priest, Beyond the Limits of Thought (Oxford University Press, 2002), chs. 9, 10.) Given an interpretation, diagonalisation allows one to construct an object not in its domain (Transcendence); but the object is clearly in the domain of all quantifiable objects, since one quantifies over it (Closure). One should therefore expect inclosure contradictions to arise in this context. Paraconsistent set theory quantifies over all sets, and provides a set of all sets to play the role of the domain in a semantic interpretation for the language. All this is entirely natural: no new mechanisms and strategies have to be invoked to handle AUQ. (On paraconsistent set theory and metatheory, see In Contradiction, ch. 18.)

In his essay, Uzquiano provides a contradiction that AUQ generates when certain natural mereological principles are applied to ZF set theory with plural quantifiers and urelements. In a nutshell, the totality of all sets must be of inaccessible size, but the mereological principles imply that the totality is the same size as a power set, and so not inaccessible. This is not a standard paradox of self-reference, but it, too, is accommodated naturally in dialetheic set theory. If V is the set of all sets, it is not difficult to show that the powerset of V, Ã(V), has the same size as V -- even though it is larger (Cantor's paradox). Hence, the cardinality of V can be both inaccessible and accessible.

Despite the naturalness of a paraconsistent approach to these problems, such barely rates a mention in the essays in the volume. Wright and Shapiro (pp. 271-2) note, in effect, the connection between the Inclosure Schema and indefinite extensibility, but say that dialetheism is 'not for those of a nervous disposition'. (Personally, I get nervous when there are lots of ad hoc constructions designed to avoid the apparently obvious.) Weir (p. 342) notes the possibility of a dialetheic position, but says of dialetheism that 'most philosophers remain unconverted'. (A true sociological observation …) And Williamson (p. 387) simply says that 'dialetheism is a fate worse than death'. (Well, I haven't died yet, so I'm not in a position to judge.)

I think it a pity that the editors did not include at least one essay which did not foreclose the natural dialetheic approach to the issue quite so peremptorily. Other than that, I have nothing but praise for the collection.