Absolute Time: Rifts in Early Modern British Metaphysics

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Emily Thomas, Absolute Time: Rifts in Early Modern British Metaphysics, Oxford University Press, 2018, 236pp., $61.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198807933.

Reviewed by Douglas Jesseph, University of South Florida


Philosophers have long been concerned with the nature of time, and quite a number of seventeenth-century British thinkers theorized on the subject in some detail. Emily Thomas proposes to guide the reader through "the development of absolute time during one of Britain's richest and most creative metaphysical periods, from the 1640s to the 1730s" (p. 1). The result is a book that contains some significant insights into the philosophy of time in Early Modern Britain, but is ultimately unsatisfying. Part of the problem lies with the scope of authors and doctrines considered. Newton's Principia is scarcely considered (although his enigmatic unpublished essay "De Gravitatione et Equiponderatione Fluidorum" merits a chapter). Further, the views of Thomas Hobbes and George Berkeley are left out of this developmental story for the odd reason that the current extent of scholarship on their doctrines makes the consideration of their views otiose (p. 5). Despite the fact that notable topics and authors are left out of the story Thomas tells, her book does have the virtue of bringing attention to some hitherto neglected authors.

Thomas discerns four different approaches to the philosophy of time in seventeenth-century British philosophy (pp. 7-9). Those who deny that time is anything at all are deemed adherents of the "void theory"; Thomas assigns Anthony Collins and William Wollaston to this group. Assuming that the world has a temporal structure, one might opt for "idealism" or the doctrine that time consists of "abstract, mind-dependent relations" (a view Thomas attributes to Hobbes, Edmund Law, Isaac Watts, and Berkeley). Those who opt for "realism" about time agree that it is independent of all forms of mental activity, but this group subdivides into "absolutists" who take time to be independent of the actions of material bodies, and "relationalists" who identify time with the motions of bodies or some sort of relations holding among them. Thomas's concern in the book is almost exclusively with the debate between absolutists and relationalists. The issue separating the two theories can be phrased in terms of the coherence of the notion of temporal vacua: could there be a stretch of time in which literally nothing happens, aside from the mere passage of time? Absolutists agree that such vacua are conceptually possible, where relationalists deny such a possibility.

The book's ten chapters are arranged chronologically. The first offers what Thomas terms a "Cook's Tour" through the philosophy of time from Antiquity through Descartes, and then attempts to summarize competing approaches to time in early seventeenth-century British philosophy. The second chapter is devoted to Henry More's absolutist conception of time, and the third is concerned with the absolutism of Pierre Gassendi and its further elaboration by Walter Charleton and Jean Baptiste von Helmont. Chapter four examines Isaac Barrow's treatment of space and time, while the fifth chapter summarizes early British reactions to temporal absolutism. The sixth chapter is a study of time in Newton's "De Gravitatione." Chapter seven makes the case for reading John Locke as a "steadfast relationalist" about space and time. The last three chapters examine late seventeenth and early eighteenth century British reactions to spatio-temporal absolutism.

Thomas covers an enormous amount of material in just over 200 pages, with the result that her treatment of central issues can be brief to the point of superficiality. The third, fifth, and eighth chapters fill a combined twenty-five pages and offer little beyond brief summaries of doctrines and disputes. The most substantive chapters are the second and fourth, and I will concern myself principally with them. The ninth and tenth chapters is also of interest, largely because they introduce figures who are generally overlooked in histories of early modern metaphysics.

More has long been seen as one of the foremost absolutists about space, but his views on time have generally been ignored, principally on the grounds that he had little to say about the nature of time. Thomas sees More as having a genuine metaphysics of time, which developed from an early doctrine indebted to the neo-Platonism of Plotinus to a later view in which eternal duration is literally an attribute of God. According to Thomas, More identified space with a divine attribute, namely God's immensity or omnipresence. However, she discerns a significant asymmetry in his treatment of divine presence in space as opposed to time: "God is extendedly present in space, yet holenmerically present in time" (p. 31). The distinction between extended and holenmeric presence is roughly this: a thing has extended place when it occupies a particular region in such a way that distinct parts of the region contain distinct parts of the thing; but something has holenmeric presence when every part of a region contains the whole thing and the whole is contained in every part. Scholastic doctrine held that a body has extended presence by occupying a particular region (where parts of the region contain parts of the body), but the soul has holenmeric presence in the human body since it is entirely contained in every animate part and every animate part contains the whole soul.[1]

Thomas notes that More rejected the holenmeric account of the soul's presence in the body or God's presence in the universe, opting instead for the view that spirits are extended but can permeate or penetrate material bodies (which are impenetrable) and whose parts are "indiscerpible" or incapable of actual division into separate parts (whereas physical bodies are actually divisible). In the case of time, however, Thomas holds that More understood God's temporal presence holenmerically, which is to say that God is entirely present in every part of time. This presumably contrasts with the relation that finite beings have to time: my past and future states are not currently present with me. The difficulty here is that the textual basis adduced for this reading is quite scant. In one passage from a scholium to the 1679 revised edition of his Enchiridion metaphysicaum More claimed to "assign duration to eternity, which however I consider in no way to be successive," adding that God's eternity is present "at all physical moments of time." From this, Thomas infers that "More seems to mean that God's whole being is in every moment yet is not spread out through time -- in other words, God is holenmerically present in time" (p. 45). The relevant passage does bear that interpretation, but we are left with the odd consequence that "More did not perceive the contrast" between his accounts of divine presence in space and time. It is also noteworthy that this is the only passage in More's vast philosophical corpus that Thomas adduces as evidence for her reading. So, if Thomas is correct, More stumbled into a treatment of time that is fundamentally different from his treatment of space, yet took no notice of this asymmetry in the solitary passage where he put his view in print. In the end, I came away persuaded that the received view on More's philosophy of time is essentially correct: he simply didn't have much in the way of a coherent and well-developed view on the subject.

Thomas's account of Barrow's approach to space and time aims to show that he upheld a version of relationalism that she terms "modal relationalism." This is a significant departure from the received view, which takes Barrow to have propounded a variety of spatio-temporal absolutism that strongly influenced Newton's treatment of the subject. Her reading begins with Barrow's treatment of space and extends this to time, so we can begin by considering his views on space. Modal relationalism of the spatial variety holds that space is a system of relations holding among possible objects (or, perhaps better, among possible locations of objects). According to Thomas, Barrow was a modal relationist about space because he understood space to be a relational mode of non-contiguity: "where things are contiguous with one another, there is no space; where things are non-contiguous with one another, there is space" (p. 83). The modal aspect of this theory is that it is concerned with possible positions that an object might occupy. So, in addition to the locations occupied by the bodies in the universe, there are many other locations where God might have placed them. Thus, because God might have placed the entire universe 5 km north of its current location, there is a space extrinsic to the current universe.

The textual source for this reading is a "puzzling passage" from the tenth of Barrow's Mathematical Lectures. The lecture takes up the question of what it means for a magnitude to occupy space. It begins by reviewing the arguments for and against the possibility of spatial vacua: common experience leads us to conclude that space is distinct from the magnitudes that fill it, but philosophers of the rank of Aristotle and Descartes have adduced seemingly powerful arguments against the possibility of spatial vacua. Barrow took it upon himself to resolve this dispute by endorsing two theses. The first is

that there really is space distinct from magnitude; that is, by this word 'space' something is designated, that a concept answers to it, it has a basis in things, that it differs from the concept of magnitude, and so where no magnitude exists, or even if there were no magnitude at all, space would nevertheless exist.[2]

The second thesis is that "space is not something actually existing and actually different from things having quantity, much less that it has some dimensions proper to itself, actually separate from the dimensions of magnitude."[3]

What primarily makes the passage puzzling is that John Kirkby's 1734 translation takes the second thesis to say that space "is not any thing actually existent, and actually different from Quantity," which puts the two theses in contradiction. According to the first thesis, space is distinct from magnitude (or continuous quantity), while Kirkby's version of the second thesis declares that space is not distinct from quantity. However, if we take Barrow's 'diversum a rebus quantis' in his second thesis to mean "different from things having quantity" it becomes tolerably clear. Consider a billiard ball at rest on a table. It seems absurd to claim there are really two things present there: the spherical ball and the space that it occupies. I take Barrow's second thesis to mean that when something having quantity (an abstract geometric object or a physical billiard ball) has a specific location, we should not take the occupied space to be something ontologically distinct from the object. This is consistent with the Cartesian thesis that there is no real distinction between a body and the space it occupies. Barrow's first thesis, however, is a straightforward endorsement of spatial absolutism: space is not ontologically dependent upon the existence of bodies (or magnitudes generally), and even if there were no magnitudes in existence there would still be space and spatial structure, because there would remain many positions in which things might be placed. The modal relationalism that Thomas attributes to Barrow is supposed to explain "how it is consistent for Barrow to describe space and time as distinct from magnitude yet as nothing different from quantity" (p. 83). But because Barrow's text (as opposed to Kirkby's translation) does not actually assert that space does not differ from quantity, there is nothing to explain.

Further, Thomas acknowledges that in Barrow's most extensive treatment of time (in the first of his Geometrical Lectures) he speaks of time "flowing" equably and independently of any motions, events, or processes. This makes it difficult to see how he might have been a relationalist, since he explicitly acknowledged the possibility of temporal vacua. Thomas insists that Barrow's brand of specifically modal relationalism permits him to distinguish the sequence of actual events from the sequence of possible events that constitute the essence of time:

For the non-modal relationalist, there is no sense in which time is independent of actual things. To illustrate, if our entire universe were to be destroyed, there would be no time. In contrast, for Barrow, there would be time, because things could possibly come to exist. (p. 89)

This, however, makes it difficult to discern any interesting distinction between modal relationism and absolutism. Both doctrines assume an infinite, uncreated, eternal, indestructible, and uniform frame of spatial and temporal reference, so it is impossible to see Barrow's alleged modal relationism as anything other than spatio-temporal absolutism.

These problems aside, the book does advance our understanding seventeenth-century theorizing about time. In particular, Thomas's ninth chapter, which deals with the development of Samuel Clarke's notions on time brings to light material that has not generally been taken seriously by historians of early modern metaphysics. Likewise, her tenth chapter gives an excellent account of the theological and philosophical battles over the nature of time that figure prominently in early eighteenth-century British intellectual life. Thus, although there are certain respects in which Thomas might fall short, her work will find a place in the scholarship on theories of time in the Early Modern era.

[1] The term 'holenmeric' is More's coinage. Traditional Scholastic teaching characterized the distinction as one between circumscriptive and definitive place: a body has circumscriptive place when it can be bounded by a spatial region; the soul has definitive place because it exercises its power throughout an animate body.

[2] "Dicerem primo spatium reverâ dari, distinctum a magnitudine; hoc est, illo nomine designari quid, ei conceptum respondere, fundatum in re, alium a conceptu magnitudinis, ac ita quidem ut ubi non existit magnitudo, quamvis ea non exsisteret omnino, spatium nihilominus extiturum" (Barrow [1860] 1973, 1: 158).

[3] "Dicerem secundo, spatium non esse quid actu existens, actuque diversum a rebus quantis, nedum ut habeat dimensiones aliquas sibi proprias, a magnitudinis dimensionibus actu separatas" (Barrow [1860] 1973, 1: 158).