Abstract Market Theory

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Jonathan Roffe, Abstract Market Theory, Palgrave Macmillan, 2015, 180pp., $100.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781137511744.

Reviewed by Michael Munger, Duke University


What is "price," and what is the role of price in market-oriented society? More importantly, what is the relation between price and value?

One possibility for "value" is that the worth of actions and things is self-evident, and therefore need not be discussed much. This seems unlikely. In the absence of self-evident consensus, there must be some process by which disagreements about value become -- or tend towards -- consensus. In societies, or any context with large groups of people, there are three mechanisms for generating such a consensus: (1) actual consensus, as the result of deliberation; (2) rule-produced consensus, where there is prior agreement on a process and a result is generated; and (3) decentralized anonymous processes that converge toward a signal of value.

1. The first process, deliberation, is possible but inconvenient for quotidian affairs ("How much should lettuce be valued?" A lengthy discussion would "cost" more than the value being arrived at is worth).

2. The second process is politics, and value is determined by voting or some other preference aggregation mechanism based on social choice.

3. The third mechanism is markets, which aggregate the information of desires, sources, and alternative uses to generate (under conditions of low transactions costs and substantial competition) a statistic or measure of that value. The name for this signal is "price."

Each of these consensus-generating mechanisms have useful features in some settings, and flaws -- potentially crippling flaws -- in others.

Jonathan Roffe sets out to evaluate markets as generators of values. He pursues both the ontological problem -- just what is "a" or "the" market? -- and the ethical problem -- how are we to think of the values generated by prices, or do prices really say anything about values at all?

It appears that Roffe is very well read on the background and nature of prices and value. The discussion of the relation of price and value, and the problems of using the first as a stand-in for the second, are quite useful.

A minor difficulty is that in several places, Roffe highlights "bugs" that are in fact features. On page 11 he introduces us to the (correct) idea that price movements in "thick" (that is, heavily traded) markets are stochastic. This notion recurs at several points, and I think that he intends this observation as a claim that markets, whatever they do measure, are not revealing information about "value." How could random movement have anything to do with value, which is solid and important and objective?

The problem is that the so-called "efficient markets hypothesis" is operating in the background. Consider the following argument: the current price of an asset reflects the expectation that people have about the amount that people will be willing to pay for that asset in the future. The "market" is a set of mechanisms for making conjectures (you might think of these as "bets") about those future values. Price movements coordinate disagreements, or differences in these expectations, in the Hayekian view of "prices as mechanism for resolution."

That cashes out to a rather surprising conclusion about markets: All available information is "capitalized" in the current price. The reason is that a person will sell if she thinks others overestimate the future price, and buy if she thinks others underestimate it. Given the distribution of costs involved in buying and selling, the price that results from this process will reflect the expectations of all traders.

But then the only way that the price could change is if some new information not foreseen by the traders is revealed. If this were not true, then it would have been possible for at least one trader to have foreseen the price movement, given information that was available in the previous period. But then the trader would have traded on that information, given her expectation.

What that means is that pricing mechanisms in markets are not stochastic at all; in principle, given a fixed set of data, the prices in different sub-markets would converge to a single price. But it is true that prices in actual markets, with constant updates of information and changes in expectations, are conditionally stochastic: price movements are unpredictable. And in fact price movements must be unpredictable; else, someone would have predicted the movement and acted on it, in which case it would have already happened.

This is not to say that prices are "correct," ex post. Far from it. Prices swing wildly, in some cases revealing that traders are confused about the correct value of the asset. But the pricing mechanism is the only means available of coordinating the extensive disagreement that arises from diverse expectations and information held by individuals.

The reason I have imposed this extended explanation on the reader is that it is possible to misunderstand the claim for why prices are useful. And I think that Roffe does make such a mistake. Consider his conclusion:

to think that pricing models are a reliable means of prediction is to be under the sway of a kind of manic delusion: that every future event is within the scope of human reason and can be known in advance. To trade in derivatives is to dance well beyond the circle of the firelight, in a night whose blackness contains monsters unknown and unknowable but for the dramatic consequences of our encounters with them. (p. 14)

Well, gosh. I have some sympathy for scorning derivatives traders, after the havoc wrought in 2007-8 by collateralized debt obligations and credit default swaps, but surely it's a question of degree. Competitive markets are a "discovery process," in the words of Hayek. That means that the knowledge we would need to gauge the relative value of resources is hidden, and pieces of information are deeply buried in isolated niches around the economy. To "rely" on prices remaining stable might be a "manic delusion," but there is no alternative. Using votes to judge the value of resources is pointless, and deliberative consensus is obviously unattainable at the scale of even a city much less a national economy.

I had expected the Roffe would lean on the distinction made by Frank Knight:

Uncertainty must be taken in a sense radically distinct from the familiar notion of Risk, from which it has never been properly separated. The term "risk," as loosely used in everyday speech and in economic discussion, really covers two things which, functionally at least, in their causal relations to the phenomena of economic organization, are categorically different . . . The essential fact is that "risk" means in some cases a quantity susceptible of measurement, while at other times it is something distinctly not of this character . . . It will appear that a measurable uncertainty, or "risk" proper, as we shall use the term, is so far different from an unmeasurable one that it is not in effect an uncertainty at all. We shall accordingly restrict the term "uncertainty" to cases of the non-quantitative type. It is this "true" uncertainty, and not risk, as has been argued, which forms the basis of a valid theory of profit and accounts for the divergence between actual and theoretical competition. (Knight, 1924, Chapter 1, Part 1)

That is, Roffe is simply pointing out -- and correctly -- that the pricing models he considers a "manic delusion" are committing an elementary category mistake. These models take a situation of Knightian uncertainty, where even the unknowns are unknown, and shoehorn predictions into a situation of risk, where there are unknowns but these unknowns are known to be unknown, and are known to be defined according to probability distributions of which the modeler has definite knowledge. This distinction, which is central to Roffe's critique, has in fact been a core part of orthodox economic thought since the 1920s.

To make matters worse, Roffe then makes a rather large inferential leap: he claims that since option pricing models are a "manic delusion," pricing itself must be catastrophically flawed. This seems akin to claiming that celestial mechanics is flawed because the geocentric model of the cosmos was completely misspecified. But we can't confuse the inadequacy of human efforts at prediction or explanation (naïve faith in which Roffe rightly notes proved catastrophic in the financial meltdown of 2008) with the coherence of the underlying process. It may be accurate to compare option pricing modelers to the Ptolemaic cosmology, mind you. But that doesn't mean that the physics of price adjustment is random or chaotic; it just means that we can't predict prices very well. And remember, the contingent randomness of price movements is actually a sign that all available information is capitalized in prices.

By believing that Knightian uncertainty -- which cannot be accurately priced -- could be understood as Black-Merton-Scholes risk -- which can be priced, up to the distribution of outcomes specified in the universally known probability distribution function which describes outcomes -- the traders and "technical" analysts Roffe decries did in fact fall into a manic delusion. But it is an important feature of the price system that it aggregates, in a "discovery process," all the disparate information possessed by all those who have financial standing to participate. In other words, starting with Knightian uncertainty, about which nothing is known and in fact in which it is not even known precisely what is unknown, the exercise of allowing unfettered trade in assets produces a statistic, called price, which is an estimate of the opportunity cost, or value foregone, of using or consuming that asset in a particular way.

The mistake of the traders was to think that they could produce an independent "true" price, using the model assuming risk, meaning they had far more information than in fact they had. Given that "true," objectively correct price, of course, they could arbitrage based on the difference between the "true" price and the observed price in the market. Specifically, if the observed price is below the "true" (model) price, one should buy. If the observed price is above the modeled price, one should sell. Or one can skip that whole step, and write put or call options to go "long" or "short" on the future price movements of the asset in question.

To put it more simply, the architecture of the price system requires that if it is to do its job for society, it be impossible -- not hard, impossible -- to predict price movements, even in the near term. If this were possible, then the pricing system would be leaving out some important and identifiable relevant information that the modeler can use to forecast the "correct" price, which is different from the observed price by the value implied by the excluded information. So, Roffe's critique of the pricing model of Black-Merton-Scholes is perfectly correct. But the larger point, that this means the pricing mechanism itself is unusable, simply does not follow. In fact, the randomness of price movements is actually consistent with the claim that the price mechanism is working perfectly. The financial crisis was caused by an over-reliance on models, not an over-reliance on prices.

Roffe's analysis rests on a plainly false basic premise. "Definition 1" asserts that "The orthodox conception of the market is organized around the probabilistic modeling of the market." But this confuses the workings of the market as an objective process playing out empirically, in the world, with the abstract models that human modelers, in this case economists, use to understand and predict the market. The branch of economics that derives from the Knight-Hayek conception of the market as a discovery process in the face of profound uncertainty (not risk, uncertainty) would deny the basic definition as absurd. The confusion is between the model (Ptolemy's model of the sun circling the earth) and actual celestial mechanics (the earth objectively circles the sun). No human being needs to have a correct model of cosmology for the physics of planetary movement to work in consistent -- even deterministic -- ways.

Roffe's critique of models, then, simply restates the nearly hundred year old (and widely recognized) critique made by Knight (1921). In this, Roffe is correct, but unoriginal. His critique of markets confuses the thing with the model of the thing, and so does not even address the problem of markets in any important or useful way.


Hayek, Friedrich A. 1945. The Use of Knowledge in Society. American Economic Review. 35(4): 519-30.

Hayek, F.A. "Competition as a Discovery Procedure." The Quarterly Journal of Austrian Economics 5, No. 3 (Fall 2002): 9-23.

Knight, Frank. 1921. Risk, Uncertainty, and Profit. Hart, Schaffner & Marx Prize Essay, Houghton Mifflin Co.