Abstraction and Infinity

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Paolo Mancosu, Abstraction and Infinity, Oxford University Press, 2016, viii + 222pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198724629.


Reviewed by Philip A. Ebert, University of Stirling


This is a very rich and rewarding book. It provides not merely a much-needed, detailed account of the history of so called definitions by abstraction or abstraction principles, but also advances the current philosophical debate about the foundational status of such principles. These themes are presented in a beautifully clear prose which makes this book, quite simply, a joy to read -- not something that is easily accomplished by a book in the history and philosophy of mathematics.


The book is divided into four chapters. The first two focus on the history of mathematical practice with regards to definitions by abstraction. The third chapter offers a short history of the notion of infinity and then presents two contemporary theories of measuring the size of infinite sets. The last chapter brings together the two themes -- abstraction and infinity -- and develops a new kind of criticism against Neo-Logicism, one of the 21st century proponents of definitions by abstraction.


Neo-Logicism, sometimes also labelled Neo-Fregeanism or Abstractionism, is a view that has its origin in Crispin Wright (1983). The story is now all too familiar, so I'll keep it short: Gottlob Frege (1848-1925) sought to establish Logicism -- the view that arithmetic and other branches of mathematics can be reduced to logic. However, his project failed after Russell informed Frege that one of his axioms, Basic Law V, is inconsistent. The Neo-Logicist aims to revive Frege's project by replacing Basic Law V with a different foundational principle known as Hume's Principle. Both share a common form; they are abstraction principles:[1]


(AP) §α=§β αβ


where '§' is a term-forming operator applicable to expressions of the type of α and β (introducing 'abstracta'), and  is an equivalence relation on entities denoted by expressions of that type. Frege's Basic Law V involves co-extensionality of functions as the relevant equivalence relation on the right-hand side, introducing value-ranges as abstracta:[2]


(BLV) Value range of fx= Value range of g(x) x(f(x) = g(x))

while Hume's Principle employs equinumerosity as the relevant equivalence relation, introducing cardinal numbers:[3]

  Nx:Fx = Nx:Gx F ≈ G

Thanks to Frege's theorem, first proved in Wright (1983),[4] we know that HP embedded in standard second-order logic, suffices to derive second-order Peano Arithmetic, a result which led to the revival of the Fregean programme. The last 30 years produced many interesting mathematical results (e.g. attempts to expand the abstractionist programme to real analysis and set theory) and generated wide-ranging philosophical debates about the semantics, epistemology, and ontology of abstraction principles.[5] However, there has so far been very little debate about the history of the use of abstraction principles.


From this perspective, Mancosu's first two chapters are an extremely welcome contribution which highlights the widespread use of definition by abstraction in mathematics throughout its history. Examples of the use of abstraction principles range from Euclid to Leibniz to early 19th century mathematicians. Mancosu shows how prevalent such definitions were before Frege, and he offers examples of their use in geometry, number theory, and physics.


Yet, Mancosu achieves much more than offering a mere history of abstraction principles. For example, based on his historical overview he distinguishes three options of how to interpret the abstractum of an abstraction principle:

  1. It is a representative of the relevant equivalence class, i.e. one of its objects (characteristic of its use in 19th century number theory).
  2. The abstractum of an element in the domain is the equivalence class which contains that element.
  3. The abstracta are sui generis and neither coincide with an element of the domain nor with an equivalence class (Grassmann's, as well as the Neo-Logicist conception).

Mancosu uses this threefold distinction to identify views held by different abstractionists, and to highlight that achieving clarity with respect to this distinction led to genuine progress. In that context, he offers a re-assessment of Frege's contribution. While noting important influences on Frege (particularly Grassmann's[6]), he argues that Frege provided the first clear characterisation of interpreting abstraction principles along option 2. Moreover, Frege was likely the first person to introduce and discuss higher-order abstraction principles.


Another highlight of chapter 2 are passages (cf. pp.67ff.) that resemble a crime story more than a history of mathematics. By drawing on numerous sources and on intriguing circumstantial evidence, Mancosu identifies the "teachers" that Frege likely had in mind when, in the most famous passage of Grundlagen (§64), Frege rejects the use of the direction abstraction principle to explain the equivalence relation parallelism on the basis of a prior grasp of the concept direction.


Overall, I thoroughly enjoyed reading these two chapters. Mancosu chooses just the right level of detail while managing to cover the expansive history of abstraction principles. He also leaves important reminders to the "a-historically"-minded philosopher that, all too often, more recent debates have important precursors in its history. Moreover, the many intriguing connections that Mancosu uncovers raise new questions. For example, he shows how Helmholtz used definitions by abstraction to define weights, brightness, pitch of tones, and much more. One may wonder whether these applications influenced Frege in thinking that it is just these kinds of principles that are particularly suited to guarantee the application of mathematics. Also, Frege's argument (the notorious Caesar Problem) that challenges the adequacy of HP, or indeed of abstraction principles generally, as a genuine form of definition reappears throughout the late 19th/early 20th century (in, e.g., the Italian school) and is alluded to by Fraenkel. So, one may wonder, was Frege the first person to have lodged this objection?


Chapter 3 changes tack and focuses on infinity (or, rather on how to measure sizes of infinity). The core issue is "the paradox of infinity." On the one hand, we have the part-whole intuition (PW) which states that, if A is a proper subcollection of B, then A is smaller in size than B. On the hand, it seems correct to say, following Cantor, that A and B are the same in size if and only if there will be a one to one correspondence between A and B. However, these two intuitions lead to a contradiction for infinite sets: consider A to be the set of even natural numbers and B the set of natural numbers.


In this chapter, Mancosu argues convincingly against adopting a "whig history" approach where all roads inevitably lead to Cantor. While the historical discussion is kept fairly short, Detective Mancosu still manages to unearth historical gems such as documents from the Islamic philosopher and mathematician Thabit ibn Qurra (9th century A.D.) who defended the idea of different sizes of infinity with regards to collections of natural numbers. Also, Mancosu's discussion of Maignan and Bolzano, who both defended the PW intuition, is exceptionally clear and interesting.


The second part of the chapter is concerned with recent mathematical theories that aim to respect the PW principle for infinite domains. Here, Mancosu's historical approach shines through. Instead of simply presenting the most developed view, we are first offered a brief survey of Fredric M. Katz's PhD thesis from 1981, which offers the first formal theory defending the PW intuition against Cantor. The remainder of the chapter discusses the so-called theory of numerosities.[7]


Here, I won't be able to cover the details of the theory, but what is important to note is that numerosities are introduced as measures that are more fine-grained than cardinalities. Hence,


(1) If two collections have the same size, then there is a 1-1 correspondence between its objects

remains true[8] if size means "numerosity"; the other direction


(2) If there is a 1-1 correspondence, then the two collections have the same size


is, however, false.


The theory of numerosity goes some way to capture the relevant PW intuition, but it has some shortcomings. Firstly, the current theory is restricted to "universes:" V(X) = n∈NVn(X) over a base X of size less than ω. Of course, this may be far reaching enough for some, yet one may wonder why it is that some larger sets don't have a numerosity. Secondly, the numerosity function (whose existence is equivalent to the existence of an ultrafilter) is defined on sets that can be linearly ordered. So again, why is it that only those kinds of sets can be given a "numerosity"? Lastly, and most importantly, as Mancosu himself notes, numerosities are sensitive to the relevant label or ultrafilter. Hence, whether the even numbers have the same numerosity as the odd numbers depends and varies with the choice of ultrafilter. Since there is no "canonical" ultrafilter, it seems that "having a certain numerosity" is, ultimately, a relational property between some collection and a given filter. Yet don't we think of the size of a collection as more akin to a primary property that supervenes on, and is invariant with, its extension?


Be that as it may, the force of Mancosu's objection against Neo-Logicism, does not rely on a prior acceptance of the theory of numerosities. Rather, chapter 3 is best understood as providing an important motivation that opens up the relevant conceptual space for Mancosu to launch his challenge.


Chapter 4 sets out the good company objection, which takes its cue from various passages in (Heck 2011). In a first step, Mancosu shows how we can get countably infinitely many different abstraction principles (without relying on the theory of numerosities) that agree on finite sets, but assign different cardinalities to infinite sets. He then shows that these abstraction principles suffice to prove the axioms of second-order Peano Arithmetic and meet other constraints that the Neo-Logicist proposed for a good abstraction principle (stability, non-arrogance, etc.). So, HP, and all the other principles that Mancosu offers, are in "good company". However, given that these abstraction principles disagree when it comes to infinite sets, it seems we run into the following problem:


It is conceptually possible that any of them [i.e. abstraction principles of the kind alluded to above] is false, since for any principle we choose there subsists the conceptual possibility that it might be false. The latter claim is grounded in the fact that different principles assign numbers to infinite concepts in ways that contradict each other. But if [this] is correct we should be able to infer, again by parity of argument, that no one of them can be a conceptual truth. Thus HP, and all its good companions are not conceptual truths. This is then the 'good company' objection. (p.186)


Now, there are many moves that could be made against this type of challenge. Some are not pursued in Mancosu's discussion: for example, one could stop thinking of HP as a "conceptual truth" and see it as a mere defeasible a priori truth. Alternatively, one could be more radical and deny that concept-constituting principles need be true.[9] Yet, both such proposals would undermine an important aspect of the Neo-Logicist epistemology, namely that "the fundamental truths of number theory would be revealed as consequences of an explanation: a statement whose role is to fix the character of a certain concept." (Wright, 1983, 153)


The more obvious choice, which Mancosu pursues (amongst other options) and labels "liberal Neo-Logicism", is to argue that, strictly speaking, each abstraction principle is a conceptual truth of the very concept it introduces. Hence there is no genuine incompatibility since each concept of number is in effect indexed to the relevant abstraction principle by which it is introduced. Thus, that these abstraction principles disagree when assigning different numbers to infinite sets is not a substantial disagreement.


Mancosu's ensuing discussion nicely shows how the good company objection raises numerous fundamental questions about the very aims and methods of the Neo-Logicist programme.[10] In particular, "liberal Neo-Logicism" -- previously defended by MacBride -- comes with its own challenges: e.g. this approach seems to give up on the special standing of HP as somehow implicit in informal arithmetical reasoning (to what extent this claim was ever part of the original Neo-Logicism programme is, I think, very much questionable). However, if that is the case, one may wonder why the Neo-Logicist focuses so much on HP. That is, is there an epistemically relevant difference between Wright's "Hero" character, who first learns HP and then derives PA, and a "Mancosian Hero", who learns any one of the other abstraction principles? It seems the liberalist line might have to give up on a special epistemic status of HP.


And, last but not least, the Good Company objection requires the Neo-Logicist to take a stance and solve the problem of cross-sortal identification: when are abstracts introduced by one abstraction principle the same as abstracts introduced by a different one? Mancosu takes on this problem in the last section of his book and offers a solution to a challenge set out in Cook and Ebert (2005) -- but, alas, let me come back to that on another occasion.


This overview should make clear that Mancosu's good company objection is not to be understood as a knock-down argument, but as a wide-ranging general challenge that goes to the heart of the Neo-Logicist programme -- a kind of challenge that, no doubt, will shape the future debate of this view.


In summary, I highly recommend Mancosu's book to philosophers and mathematicians interested in the philosophy or the history of mathematics and logic. It is rich in historical commentary and philosophical ideas. Mancosu not only proves to be one of the great detectives of the history of mathematical practice, but shows us how an historical approach to mathematical practice can, and in this case, does successfully move forward our current debates in the philosophy of mathematics.[11]




Benci, V. and Di Nasso, M. (2003) "Numerosities of labelled sets: A new way of counting", Advances in Mathematics, 173, 50-67.

Cook, R.T. and Ebert, P.A. (2005) "Abstraction and Identity", Dialectica, 59,121-139.

Ebert, P.A. (2016) "A Framework for Implicit Definitions and the A Priori" in Ebert and Rossberg (eds) Abstractionism, Oxford University Press, 133-160.

Ebert, P.A. and Rossberg, M. (2016) Abstractionism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Heck, R. (2011) Frege's Theorem, Oxford University Press.

MacBride, F. (2000) "On Finite Hume", Philosophia Mathematica, (3), 8, 150-159.

Scharp, K. (2013) Replacing Truth, Oxford University Press.

Whittle, B. (2017) "Size and Function", Erkenntnis, Online First, DOI: 10.1007/s10670-017-9917-z.

Wilson, M. (1992) "Frege: The Royal Road from Geometry", Noûs, 26,149-180.

Wright, C. (1983) Frege's Conception of Numbers as Objects, Aberdeen University Press.

[1] For simplicity, I omit prefixed universal quantifiers from each abstraction principle.

[2] In words: the value range of f is identical to the value range of g iff f and g have the same value for any argument.

[3] In words: the cardinal number belonging to the concept F is identical to the cardinal number belonging to the concept G iff there is a one to one correspondence between the objects falling under F and those falling under G.

[4] Compare Heck (2011), p.5ff. for a history of Frege’s theorem.

[5] To indulge in ruthless self-promotion: compare Ebert & Rossberg (2016) – a volume dedicated to recent developments on Neo-Logicism. For a summary of the status belli, consult our introduction.

[6] Mancosu here challenges Wilson (1992) who identified von Staudt as the main influence.

[7] As introduced in Benci and Di Nasso (2003).

[8] This direction was recently challenged in Whittle (2017).

[9] Compare here Scharp (2013) and Ebert (2016).

[10] Mancosu is historically acute and draws on a previous discussion by Heck (2011) and MacBride (2000).

[11] Many thanks to Kevin Scharp and Crispin Wright for a very enjoyable and stimulating reading group on Mancosu’s book.