Acceptable Premises: An Epistemic Approach to an Informal Logic Problem

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James B. Freeman, Acceptable Premises: An Epistemic Approach to an Informal Logic Problem, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 416pp, $34.99, ISBN 0521540607.

Reviewed by Hans V. Hansen, University of Windsor


This is Professor Freeman's second major contribution to the study of argument. It follows his earlier and well-regarded Dialectics and the Macrostructure of Arguments (1991). His objective in the present work is to give an account of when the basic premises, that is, the un-inferred premises, of an argument are acceptable; not just the premises of a philosophical argument, but any kind of argument, even an everyday one. Generally the work is concerned with questions in the philosophy of language and the theory of knowledge, but it focuses on examining different sources of presumption for different kinds of sentences or beliefs that are possible acceptable basic premises. It draws substantially on the work of such historical figures as Thomas Reid and David Ross; it also relies a great deal on some contemporary thought, especially that of Alvin Plantinga and, to a lesser degree, that of Nicholas Rescher, Robert Audi, and William Alston. Freeman is able to integrate ideas of these various philosophers and piece together his own theory of premise acceptability. In general, this is a conservative work, one which builds its case carefully and systematically and throughout applauds rather than decries our epistemic abilities.

The work is divided into three parts. Part one, having four chapters, introduces the problem of premise acceptability and connects a sense of 'presumption' with dialectical argumentation and epistemological concerns. The second part -- by far the longest and most densely argued part of the book (220 pages) -- searches out, in six chapters, the various kinds of belief-generating mechanisms and uncovers principles of presumptions that connect the mechanisms with beliefs. The third and briefest part of the book, consisting of two chapters, summarizes how an epistemic casuistry of basic premises might be adapted from the theory developed, and then deals briefly with some expected objections to the views presented.

To motivate this inquiry into the normative standard for acceptable premises, Freeman begins by showing the shortcomings of some of the extant views. That a basic premise should be true, for example, is neither a necessary nor a sufficient condition of premise acceptability: it could be true even with most of the available evidence against it, or it could be false and yet have exceptionally strong support. Other possible standards such as certainty, being known to be true, and being probable are also examined and found to be wanting (chapter 1). Ultimately, following Rescher's suggestion in Dialectics (1977), the second chapter picks up and further advances the connection between premise acceptability and presumptions. Rescher's thought was that presumptions are truth candidates. R. C. Pinto developed this in his 1984 article, "Dialectic and the structure of argument," saying that there is a presumption for a proposition at a point in a discussion if and only if the person must either concede the proposition or make a case against it (26). Freeman adopts a generic dialectical approach to viewing arguments. Arguments stem from proponents; questions of premise acceptability belong to argument challengers. Adopting the following "challenger presumption" formula, Freeman connects Pinto's idea with rational acceptability: A statement S is rationally acceptable for a person P at a time if and only if given the commitments of P as a challenger at that time, there is a presumption in favour of S for P at that time (32). Under what conditions, then, are there presumptions for statements?

Principles of presumption connect sources of beliefs with beliefs for which there is a presumption. The kind of sources Freeman has in mind are belief-generating mechanisms. (This is the central topic of chapter 3). Such mechanisms can account for the existence of non-inferred propositions (which is what basic premises must be) but they can at the same time be open to evaluation. If the mechanisms operate up to a standard, then the statements they issue will approach the status of presumptions. The standard that a belief-generating mechanism must satisfy -- in Freeman's theory -- is that of a Plantinga-style warrant (see his Warrant and Proper Function, 1993); that is, it must be in good working order, be operating in the appropriate medium, be truth-oriented and objectively reliable. However, that a belief stems from such a mechanism is not enough to make it the case that there is a presumption for the belief; it must also satisfy the pragmatic condition (owed to D. S. Clark, Jr.), viz., "if the cost of mistakenly accepting p outweighs the cost of obtaining further evidence, then p is not acceptable on the basis of the evidence e proffered" (62), that is, on the basis of satisfying the four conditions of a warrant. But if a belief resulting from a belief-generating mechanism has satisfied the conditions of warrant and the pragmatic condition, then there will be a presumption for that belief, and hence it will be acceptable.

With this general framework for acceptability depending on presumptions laid out, it remains to show (a) that we do in fact have the reliable belief-generating mechanisms for all the kinds of statements that could be basic, non-inferred premises, and (b) that the mechanisms can provide a presumption of warrant for them. To approach these questions systematically, Freeman develops a classification of statements/beliefs in chapter 5, first dividing them into two classes: the broadly logical and the not broadly logical. The broadly logical include logically and mathematically as well as semantically true statements and the not broadly logical are in turn broken into three further types, viz., evaluations, descriptions and interpretations. Descriptions and interpretations differ in that the former are entirely extensional and the latter are not. With this four-fold typology of statements established, the book proceeds to give a chapter to each kind of statement/belief and argue that we do in fact have a faculty for generating such beliefs. Thus chapter 6 maintains that a priori intuition is just such a source of reliable basic beliefs for the class of broadly logical statements; chapter 7 that the belief-generating mechanisms, perception, memory, and introspection will yield the descriptive sentences; chapter 8 that various kinds of intuition are the sources of interpretative statements; and chapter 9 that both moral sense and moral intuition are generators of beliefs/statements expressing value. However, each one of these mechanisms can lead to presumptions only if the beliefs they are generating are warranted. Hence, Freeman argues for each of them that they satisfy the four conditions of a warrant that he accepts from Plantinga.

Warrant is an externalist notion. One cannot know from the inside whether conditions are normal, or whether the mechanism produces objectively probable beliefs; however, presumption of warrant, Freeman maintains, is internalist: if A is aware of good evidence for p, not aware of any evidence against p (and aware that the pragmatic condition is satisfied), then there is a presumption that p is acceptable. "By defining acceptability in terms of presumption and showing that presumption for a belief amounts to presumption of warrant for that belief together with the pragmatic condition," writes Freeman, "we have set forth an internalist account of acceptability" (71-72).

However, Freeman doesn't want the kind of internalism that includes the meta-requirement that one knows there is a warrant of presumption for one's acceptable beliefs. Were that required, few would have any justified or acceptable beliefs at all (whereas they plainly do), and the door would be wide open, thinks Freeman, to skepticism. Accordingly, in chapter 4, he adopts a conception of justification from Alston that avoids this difficulty: a belief is justified for a person just in case she has adequate grounds for it and she is unaware of any overriders for it (79). He finds that Alston's view of justification coincides exactly with warranted presumption and so is able to identify his own position as an "externalist-internalism": a premise can be acceptable to a challenger without her being aware "that certain features of one's cognitive situation create a presumption for one's belief" (88).

The title of the book is Acceptable Premises. The reader should realize, however, that this is a work not about premise acceptability in general but about basic-premise acceptability. This may well be the most outstanding and pressing problem about premises, but it is surely not the only one. Freeman might argue that the other problems that can beset premises -- being vague, inconsistent, containing ambiguity, etc. -- are all taken care of by other branches of logic, epistemology, or argumentation. Perhaps so, but this needs saying, if not argument.

If all arguments rest on basic premises, and all basic premises are acceptable only if there is a presumption of warrant for them, is it the case that all conclusions of arguments, all beliefs supported by arguments, are no more than presumptions? This line of thought seems to me to be tempting, and I wonder whether Freeman would endorse it. Others have treated presumptions as a category distinct from fact, truth, and values (Chaim Perelman), and so they would not be committed to such an outcome.

In spite of the continuing discussion it is sure to engender, Acceptable Premises may well be the most extensive discussion and development of the notion of epistemological presumption in the philosophical literature. It is also a work that bridges the work done in two communities which are not as aware of each others' work as they might profitably be. There is, on the one hand, the informal logic or argumentation community of scholars. One of their main research topics is precisely that of premise acceptability, and Freeman's book is tailored exactly for that audience. However, this community, to my mind, has not followed closely enough recent developments in epistemology. Professor Freeman's book provides an important service by reminding argumentation theorists of the large body of philosophical literature relevant to its interests. On the other hand, with some exceptions like Alvin Goldman, Robert Pinto, and Harvey Siegel, many in epistemology pay little heed to their colleagues who labour in argumentation studies, and so they miss the nest of problems that arise in connection with practical applications -- a situation to which Freeman's epistemic casuistry is a response. The author has drawn on the literature of both communities, he has presented a broad and coherent view, explicitly supported by arguments at every turn, of what a theory of basic premise acceptability must accomplish; in producing the present volume he has thereby made a contribution to the philosophy of argument which, I think, is of great value to both sets of scholars.