Achieving Knowledge: A Virtue-Theoretic Account of Epistemic Normativity

Placeholder book cover

John Greco, Achieving Knowledge: A Virtue-Theoretic Account of Epistemic Normativity, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 205pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521144315.

Reviewed by Richard Fumerton, University of Iowa


Greco's book is a beautifully written, clearly argued, and aggressive defense of the idea that knowledge is a kind of success through ability. More specifically, the fundamental idea is that one knows that P when one ends up believing truly that P as a result of the exercise of an intellectual ability (the relevant virtue) one possesses. Put another way, one knows that P when one ends up with a true belief that P where the cause of having that true belief is that one exercised a cognitive skill. Much needs to be said in order to clarify and defend this "virtue-theoretic" account of knowledge and Greco tries to do just that throughout the book. We need to know how to understand the relevant notion of ability, and, importantly, we need to get very clear about just how to understand the causal role that the ability must play in producing true belief that is knowledge.

Greco's analysis of the relevant concept of ability drives the view very close to reliabilism. As I understand it, one possesses the relevant intellectual skill or ability in question (relative to some environment) in virtue of having a more or less stable disposition to respond to various stimuli with mostly true belief (in that environment) There is a reason Derek Jeter is on the cover -- he is Greco's model of a person who possesses a certain skill, in this case the ability to hit baseballs. That skill, presumably, consists in the fact that under the right sort of conditions he will succeed (more often than most -- even more often than most professionals) when trying to get a hit. When Jeter does hit a hard line drive past the infield, we credit the success (the hit) to his skill. When you know that P, according to Greco, you also have a skill, this time an intellectual skill. You have an ability to get at the truth concerning matters like this in a sufficiently high proportion of cases, and when you have a true belief we might well explain that belief by reference to your possession of the cognitive skill. When we can explain your having the true belief in this way, we'll say that you know that P. The more one thinks of the relevant intellectual skill as a disposition, and the more one thinks that the manifestation of the disposition involves a causal chain in which the ground of the disposition is affected by some stimulus and produces a belief as outcome, the closer one will see the connection between the virtue-theoretic account of the normativity involved in knowledge and the classic reliabilist account of a kind of justification, an account that can in turn be deployed in an account of knowledge

As I understand Greco, he is quite willing to admit that the relevant skills that are at play in producing true belief can come in degrees. He also seems willing to entertain contextualist ideas concerning how the relevant degree of skill required for knowledge might vary from context to context. But interestingly, and importantly, there is another critical element in his account that also admits of degrees -- the causal connection between the exercise of a skill and its resulting success. Greco readily admits that the exercise of a skill or an ability will rarely be causally or lawfully sufficient (by itself) for the truth of an "output" belief. To have an empirically true belief, the environment must causally co-operate as well. This is true whether we are talking about hitting baseballs or arriving at true beliefs. A gust of wind or an unlucky seagull can rob Jeter of his hit, and a fake barn fa├žade, a meddling mad scientist obsessed with envatting your brain, an evil demon, an ordinary illusion, and many other conditions could rob you of the true belief you ordinarily would have deserved in the exercise of your intellectual ability. There are indefinitely many causally relevant factors working together that result in that true belief. Still, such considerations do not stop us from identifying a given antecedent event as the cause of a given subsequent event. My knocking over the candle at your house caused your house to burn down, we say, despite the fact that the pernicious presence of oxygen and the fact that you didn't build your entire house out of brick were equally causally critical for the disastrous outcome. There has been a long and controversial history of philosophical attempts to explain what criteria we use in choosing from among causally necessary conditions those that are properly described as the or a cause of some subsequent state of affairs. Certainly, in the context of praising or blaming people for results (in epistemological or moral contexts) we do focus on agency rather than standing conditions or even external environmental change (though this gets complicated quickly). In any event Greco thinks that we have a firm enough grasp of the relevant distinctions that we will feel comfortable identifying in certain situations the exercise of the skill (as opposed to the co-operation of the environment) as the critical causal element whose presence yields knowledge.

The book is divided into three Parts. The chapters of Part I develop the concept of a virtue-theoretic approach sketched above and criticize alternative suggestions for how to understand the normative dimension of knowledge. The alternative approaches rejected are various proposed deontological (rule-governed) conceptions of belief-formation sufficient for knowledge and classical internalist and contemporary evidentialist accounts of justification necessary for knowledge. As it turns out, much of Greco's criticism of deontological views (understandably) rests heavily on how one understands the relevant concept of being governed by rules. If one understands the notion of following rules in such a weak way that the mere manifestation of dispositions involves some kind of rule-following, Greco obviously isn't going to complain much -- his own view will count as a version of the view that knowledge involves beliefs formed in accordance with rules. So it is the more robust notions of rule-following that are the real target of Greco's attacks.

Internalism is rejected in this part of the book primarily on the grounds that it can't give an appropriate account of the critical role that the causal history of a belief plays in determining whether or not the belief enjoys the positive epistemic status necessary for knowledge. Here I'm not sure that Greco is careful enough in distinguishing propositional and doxastic justification, but I'll have more to say about this later. Greco argues that internalist versions of evidentialism fail for the reasons that internalism fails, and externalist versions of evidentialism have too narrow a conception of what can generate knowledge. Again, a great deal depends on how exactly one understands the term "evidentialism." As Conee and Feldman use the term, for example, they want the view to be consistent with the idea that there is noninferential justification and knowledge. I think Greco has a somewhat narrower understanding of what can constitute evidence (one that is quite natural given the label "evidentialism").

Part II of the book contains chapters that address general problems that any view about knowledge must face. It begins with a more detailed discussion of how to cash out the specifics of a virtue-theoretic approach. It then goes on to explain how the virtue-theoretic approach can best explain why and how knowledge has a special sort of value. Chapter 7 of Part II delves into the complex (and sometimes conflicting) linguistic intuitions that are often offered in support of contextualist accounts of knowledge, and Greco explains how his approach to understanding knowledge can accommodate much of this data. The last chapter of Part II begins a discussion that continues again towards the end of the book. Greco is fully aware that internalists worry that externalist accounts of justification and knowledge fail to capture a concept satisfaction of which gives philosophical assurance. Here the problem is characterized as the Pyrrhonian problematic. In the last chapter of the book the issue returns as the problem of easy knowledge.

Part III deals primarily with objections that might be thought of as more specific to externalism (and reliabilism in particular). Here Greco tries to figure out how to respond to the possibility of "strange and fleeting" processes -- clairvoyant powers, for example, that come and go. While the powers last, should the resulting true beliefs be viewed as knowledge? He also addresses head on a very real problem for reliabilism -- the problem of how to understand from an externalist perspective the way in which defeating evidence can destroy the possibility of knowledge. Finally, as noted earlier, Greco returns through an interesting historical discussion of Reid and Moore to the fundamental concern that many internalists have with externalism in general, and views like Greco's in particular -- the worry that getting knowledge of the sort allowed by these views is too easy to be the sort of knowledge in which those seeking assurance of truth would be interested.

Critical Evaluation

Greco's book is exceptionally rich. Whether or not a virtue-theoretic account of knowledge is correct, its two most prominent defenders, Sosa and Greco, clearly exemplify a wide range of intellectual virtues. His arguments are clear and he fairly and sympathetically presents the views with which he disagrees. He doesn't shy away from addressing even the most difficult objections to his views. When he is not sure what to say, he always admits it with his characteristic candor and honesty. One has the sense of a philosopher who is exclusively concerned with following his philosophical instincts to arrive at the truth.

It is, of course, in the nature of these reviews that one focuses on criticism. My own philosophical instincts take me in different directions and I'll try to identify in what follows what I take to be some pivotal issues on which Greco and I disagree. I'll divide the comments, though, into internal and external worries. The internal worries are those that arise even if we presuppose the general framework within which Greco is working. The external worries are those that question fundamental planks within that framework.

Internal Criticisms: The Rejection of Internalism

One way to understand internalism is to identify it with the slogan that whatever you are justified in believing, so also is your internal twin (in this and all possible worlds). That still leaves open how to understand the relevant internal similarity -- at least some internalists will restrict the relevant states to those to which we have a privileged access. Greco doesn't seem to like much talking about epistemic justification and instead directs his criticisms at internalism understood as a view that attempts to locate the "k-normative" status of beliefs -- the kind of normative status that is critical for a true belief's being knowledge. Greco argues against internalism in a number of ways, but one way focuses on considering pairs of cases (pp. 51-53) where you have a belief with the relevant k-normative status while your internal twin does not. He goes on to argue that the relevant differences seem clearly to be a function of the etiology (the causal history) of the respective beliefs, a causal history that can affect whether or not you are sensitive in the right way to your environment. In at least some of the cases he talks about, the problem is that my internal twin hasn't based her internal belief states on the right sort of consideration (where Greco would argue that the relevant notion of basing is a causal concept).

Now, famously, many internalists might seem simply to reject Greco's intuitions about some of the cases he considers. So, for example, Greco pairs off a "normal" perceiver with his demon-deceived twin, arguing that the victim of demonic machination doesn't have beliefs with the relevant k-normative status. Greco's use of the technical expression "k-normative" complicates the issue, however. Most internalists and even many externalists feel the force of the suggestion that the victims of demonic machination are just as justified or just as rational in believing what they do as are believers who are, by hypothesis, in a "normal" perceptual situation. But do the beliefs have the same "k-normative" status? Well everyone agrees that the demon victims don't have knowledge -- they lack true belief, or even if they have through sheer luck the odd true belief, they have almost certainly been "Gettierized." The more traditional epistemologist will argue, however, that believers have taken care of what they can be held responsible for when they have responded to the available evidence (where evidence is construed broadly) with rational belief. But this probably begs the question against Greco. According to him, the normativity of knowledge is, at least in large part, a function of the successful exercise of an intellectual skill. Do the demon's victims have the requisite intellectual skill as they pursue with futility their goal of arriving at the truth about their environment? I think Greco will argue that they are like Jeter trying to get a hit in the dark, or the archer trying to hit the target when there are unpredictable gusts of wind driving the arrow off course. Jeter and the archer still have a skill, but the relevant skill and its relation to success at achieving a goal must be characterized relative to an environment. Demon victims have the intellectual skill involved in arriving at true belief about their physical environment relative to worlds in which perception works as we think it does. They don't have that skill in demon worlds. As a result their beliefs don't have "k-normative" status.

So where does that leave us? Internalists will concede that the beliefs of the demon victims lack all of the following: such beliefs aren't true, they aren't causally sensitive to the actual physical environment, they aren't reliably produced, and they don't result from the exercise of an intellectual skill if the relevant skill is defined in such a way that one has the skill only if one gets at the truth most of the time. Would the demon victims' beliefs be better somehow if they had the aforementioned properties? I don't see why the traditional internalist can't concede this (though it might depend on what sort of goodness we are talking about and what the totality of circumstances is). The internalist will insist however, that the victim's beliefs are perfectly rational, and that they do involve the exercise of intellectual skill when that skill is defined in terms of believing what it is rational to believe. The victims of the demon are believing what anyone (epistemically) ought to believe given their epistemic situation.

I began with one of Greco's pairings that raises truly fundamental issues about the normative element of knowledge. There are other pairings, however, that seem to me to raise less significant issues -- specifically those pairings where the internal twins have causally based their beliefs on different factors. I have argued elsewhere that if you want to be an internalist about epistemic justification, you had better make the distinction between doxastic and propositional justification and restrict your internalism to a thesis about the nature of propositional justification. On most plausible analyses of causation, the existence of a causal connection between, for example, sense experience and belief based on it is neither a purely internal matter nor a matter to which the believer has any sort of privileged or introspective access. Indeed, I suspect most of us are often rather bad about figuring out why (causally) we believe much of what we do. To be sure, we often harbor the conceit that our beliefs are driven only by cool considerations of epistemic rationality, but those who are minimally self-reflective will occasionally worry that they are influenced by causal factors unrelated to the epistemic likelihood of their beliefs being true.

So with the distinction between doxastic and propositional justification in hand, what does the internalist want to say about my internal twin whose beliefs are caused by wishful thinking while mine were caused by due appreciation of evidence? If my advice is followed, the internalist should say only that both individuals have the same propositional justification for their respective beliefs. If proper basing is required for doxastic justification, they don't possess the same doxastic justification. But what about k-normative status? Do the respective beliefs have the same k-normative status? Well again, if that status includes everything that is relevant to the belief's constituting knowledge the answer is obviously "No." But that is surely no mark against anything internalists have traditionally held either about justification or even about knowledge. On the assumption that we know at least some commonplace truths, there are all kinds of conditions necessary for knowledge that beliefs based on wishful thinking will lack. And that certainly includes the absence of doxastic justification.

Internal Criticisms: Cognitive Success Explained by Intellectual Skill

We saw earlier that it is central to Greco's account of knowledge that he understands knowledge as getting at the truth as a result of having an intellectual skill (relative to some environment). He is careful not to claim that the view is a complete analysis or that he can solve all of the traditional problems associated with analyzing knowledge. One set of problems centers on Gettier's famous counterexamples to knowledge and variations on those examples that have evolved over the years. Let's talk a bit about fake barn country. As everyone knows by now, we have to figure out whether someone knows based on ordinary visual experience that there is a barn out there in the field when unbeknownst to the person he is in fact looking at a real barn while there are visually indistinguishable barn facades surrounding the one real barn in the neighborhood. Most (though not all) epistemologists think that we don't have knowledge in such a situation. At first blush Greco's account seems well-suited to give us that answer. Relative to that environment it isn't plausible to say that the person's true belief resulted from the requisite intellectual skill. There are two reasons why one might say that the person lacked the relevant skill, however. One has to do with the idea that the person wouldn't get the right answer most of the time around that part of the country when relying solely on visual experience to decide that there is a barn out there. In that environment, most of the time he would have reached a false conclusion. Of course, the exercise of the relevant belief-forming disposition is still a but/for cause of having the true belief. But for relying on visual experience in the usual way, the person wouldn't have formed a true belief. But here Greco will ask us to rely on our commonsense criteria for the identification of causes. The belief-forming disposition isn't a substantial enough cause of arriving at the truth -- the more significant factor is the sheer luck involved in looking at the one real barn in the neighborhood.

But suppose instead of classic barn country our hypothetical individual is driving in a county in which there is but one fake barn surrounded by perfectly normal barns. Again, he forms on the basis of visual experience a belief that there is a barn before him (when there is). In this environment, he will be getting at the truth most of the time by relying on visual experience in this way. But sometimes Greco describes the relevant required intellectual ability as a discriminatory ability (p. 88). One doesn't have the right skill if one couldn't discriminate real barns from fake barns. Again, even if we relativize the skill to an environment, wouldn't it be true to say that in one-fake-barn country, the person lacks the relevant discriminatory skill? I'm not sure what Greco would say here, but it is dangerous epistemic country to be travelling in if the one fake barn can destroy the relevant discriminatory skill. It is a short journey in imagination from one-fake-barn country to the realm of one vivid hallucination or one vivid dream. Can I distinguish waking life from vivid dreams or hallucinations? Do I have that skill or ability? Well I might if having the skill simply involves classifying correctly most of my experiences. But if having the skill involves being able to discriminate veridical and non-veridical experiences, even in those perhaps rare situations where I have the vivid dream or hallucination, then I'm not sure anymore that I have the relevant skill. That's the extreme case, but similar puzzles arise for more mundane situations. Can I distinguish real twenty dollar bills from really good counterfeit twenties? I doubt it. But then can I know that you just handed me a twenty? There are counterfeit bills in circulation at this very moment. The answer to this question seems to me to depend critically on whether the relevant skills about which Greco talks are to be understood simply in terms of reliability or are to be understood in terms of reliability plus discriminatory capacity.

External Criticisms

I'll close by discussing briefly the fundamental issues that separate externalists and internalists. Again these are issues that, to his credit, Greco addresses head on in his discussion of the Pyrrhonian problematic and the problem of easy knowledge. It might be useful to focus on a metaphor used by Sosa that Greco talks about at some length (pp. 126-27). Sosa asks us to imagine someone looking for gold in a dark room. Let me change the thought experiment slightly. Suppose that you have heard that a certain number of people born in a certain region of Canada have a rare ability to distinguish in the dark rock that contains gold from rock that does not. Hoping that I might have the ability you kidnap me and lower me down a deep mine shaft at night. You tell me to gather the rocks that contain gold and put them in a sack to be pulled to the top. You also tell me what you are up to and guarantee me that my life will be spared if I succeed in getting you the right sort of rock. While I have no idea what I'm doing or how I'm selecting the relevant rocks, I proceed relying on whatever hunch comes to mind to fill the sack. I'm extremely curious as to how I am doing, but to my misfortunate the shaft collapses blocking any communication with the outside world and I remain wondering to the moment of my death if I was someone with the relevant ability. So as you might expect, I want you to imagine that I did indeed have the ability (I am the gold-finding equivalent of BonJour's clairvoyant) -- I loaded the sack with all and only rock containing the gold. Was this success causally explained by a skill? Yes it was. Now simply add to the story the fact that I actually found myself believing of the various rocks that I put in the sack that they contained gold. Now I have true belief that was caused by the relevant ability. But do I have knowledge? Or if there is a kind of knowledge I have, is it worth anything when it comes to the rational assurance that I might hope to get through having knowledge?

Greco is not, of course, without resources. Some of those resources relate to his discussion of defeating evidence. If I know that the ability to discriminate gold is rare, that should surely defeat whatever justification I might have. Put in Greco's terms, that should destroy the idea that my cognitive success resulted from a genuine exercise of ability. But interestingly, Greco argues that defeat is much harder to come by than one might have initially supposed. He considers, for example, the person who believes all of the premises of one of Zeno's arguments, premises which entail that there is no motion, while the person also knows that he is moving. Greco speculates that intellectual skills might be appropriately modular so that our theoretical reasoning need not destroy the successful exercise of stubborn animal-level skills. So if we suppose that I start feeling this conviction that I have picked the gold and the conviction was in fact caused by the relevant ability, then Greco is willing to claim, I think, that I've got the relevant knowledge. And he is also probably willing to claim that I could gain the "easy" knowledge that I have the relevant skill by inductively concluding that anyone who is as successful as I am at picking out gold must have the relevant skill. I suppose that's what I would probably say if I ever became convinced of externalism. But even if the only alternative to that sort of externalism is skepticism, I would live with skepticism.

In his discussion of the problem of easy knowledge, Greco discusses both Moore and Reid. He takes Moore's famous (or infamous, depending on how you look at it) "proof" of an external world as Moore's endorsement of Reid's idea that much of what one knows does not involve any sort of inference. I can't criticize Greco's interpretation of Moore too strongly as I have no really charitable alternative interpretation to offer. But I do think that in all sorts of places Moore endorses a very traditional form of foundationalism that simply won't allow even ordinary perceptually formed beliefs about macro objects to be foundationally known. In any event, the class of propositions foundationally known on Greco's view is extraordinarily large. They include not just ordinary everyday propositions describing our physical environment, but broad methodological principles of the sort Reid puts forward. The internalist will wonder how one could justify one's belief in these sometimes complex methodological principles, but Greco will respond, quite consistently, that we know the methodological principles the same way we know anything else -- through the successful exercise of an intellectual skill to arrive at the truth. We might be so constituted that the mere contemplation of certain propositions induces in us true belief, and if we have also been designed (by nature or by God) for cognitive success of this sort, then according to Greco we are in business when it comes to knowledge. The skeptic doesn't see how we can assert that we have the right skills without begging questions -- the skeptic is convinced that in the end the externalist's confidence is nothing more than blind faith.


I obviously have reservations about Greco's virtue epistemology. But I do want to end by returning to comments I made at the start. The only frustrating thing about writing this review is that there are so many interesting arguments and positions that I would have liked to discuss in more detail. Greco's book is fertile ground for truly important epistemological debate and I would recommend it strongly to anyone interested in the field of epistemology.