Achieving Our Humanity: The Idea of the Postracial Future

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Eze, Emmanuel Chukwudi, Achieving Our Humanity: The Idea of the Postracial Future, Routledge, 2001, xvii + 250pp, $23.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-415-92941-5.

Reviewed by Frank M. Kirkland, Hunter College & CUNY Graduate Center


Prior to 1985, philosophical discussions about race were conducted primarily, if not exclusively, along normative lines addressing whether and, if so, how moral or ethical salience should be granted to race and to government policy reliant on it in order to allow for differential treatment amongst groups of citizens. Bernard Boxill’s Blacks and Social Justice (1984, 1992) was and still remains the standard bearer for those discussions. Yet, in the last 20 years, philosophical discussions about race have hinged on the question of whether or not race is a “real” or “objective” property. They have increasingly and predominantly focused on race’s essentialism (or anti-essentialism), its realism (or anti-realism), its social constructivism rather than (1) its moral pertinence or impertinence to integration or to nationalism and (2) its legitimacy or illegitimacy in the framing of public policy acknowledging differential treatment along racial lines. In short, they have contributed to the idea that the metaphysics of race underwrites the political morality of race, such that any question of race’s moral import rests first on resolving the question of whether race is real or not. Kwame Anthony Appiah’s In My Father’s House: Africa in the Philosophy of Culture (1992) has been the standard bearer on this front.

Eze’s recent book follows a third path with an intriguing and novel twist. Like Boxill and Appiah, Eze argues that race is not essential to understanding and defining humankind. However, unlike Boxill’s and Appiah’s philosophical accounts about race, Eze’s takes seriously, in the first part of his book, the history of philosophy and is inseparable from it. Just as important, it takes seriously in the second part the philosophy of “negritude” as a significant response to that history and as a historical precursor to Africana philosophy. Rather than bring metaphysics to bear on race, illuminating race’s conundrums, it brings race to bear on the history of modern metaphysical and moral thinking, illuminating modern philosophy’s complicity with odious uses of race. It also brings race to bear on the history of Africana philosophy, illuminating negritude’s and Africana philosophy’s complicity with supposedly revalued uses of race. It thereby brings to the fore the idea that race has a significant impact on the genesis and structure of modern and of Africana philosophy, an impact Eze believes is best nullified than maintained.

Eze contends in the first part of his book that philosophical reflections on, say, the nature of the mind, the mind-body relation, the a priori conditions of knowledge, the nature of beauty and of morality arising during this time are fraught with “core racial assumptions” (xvi). As a consequence, modern philosophy, Eze contends, has not been impervious to intellectual processes and political courses of action that respectively have fashioned the idea of race and have shown the way to hostile campaigns in the name of race. Any version of the history of early modern philosophy to the contrary, as concerned only with “pure and universal questions about humanity” immune to the idea of race, would be the result of a “cultivated ignorance.”

To be sure this is not the stock version of the history of early modern philosophy that we “mainstream” philosophers are accustomed to researching or teaching. Nor would we “mainstream” philosophers regard it as one of those versions that infrequently appears offering new insights into that history. Still Eze raises the specter that, within the history of modern philosophy, a philosophically grounded invidious use of race explicitly provided the full rationale for the subordination of Africans and other peoples of color, since modern philosophy had been complicit in Europe’s material and symbolic superiority over and indifference to the social integration, socialization, and cultural reproductions of those within the non-European world.

The primary focus of modern philosophy, according to Eze, was the study of “man” or humanity as rational, as cultural, as civilized. Such a study required a notion against which the “varieties of man” or the varieties of humankind could be philosophically judged as either capable or incapable of reason, culture, and civilization. That notion was “race,” which is the composite idea that intellectual and moral competencies are by nature unevenly distributed among the various populations of humankind and that such uneven distributions are bound up with certain physiognomic markers, which define so-called ‘racial’ traits, supposedly reveal the inner life of the population or individual members of it, and designate populations and their individual members as superior or inferior in regard to reason, culture, and civilization. According to Eze, modern philosophers took their racial theories as serious philosophical endeavors and as deriving from principles of their overall philosophical projects.

Eze’s version of the history of modern philosophy is undeniably provocative. But it leaves a tad much to be desired with respect to the clarity, precision, and detailed articulation of central arguments. For example, Eze is critical of stock versions of modern philosophy for being “purely philosophical,” that is concerned only with metaphysical and epistemological issues immune to, if not uncoupled from, what is taken as the political discourse of race. Eze’s own version, however, assigns, say, Hume’s and Kant’s racial theories (51-111) squarely and exclusively to the philosophical realm, as a matter of the relatively autonomous history of philosophy, like Hume’s naturalism or Kant’s transcendental idealism. In effect, their racial accounts, in his mind, are part of the philosophical architecture of their naturalism and idealism respectively and necessarily woven into the history of modern philosophy. Eze, too, needs to examine their racial accounts in a “purely philosophical” arena as well.

Moreover, Eze does not assign Hume’s and Kant’s racial theories squarely to the arena of Realpolitik, does not define them as part of the political vernacular of the day. If he were to do so, their racial accounts would not be any different in kind from that of power brokers, seafarers, slaveholders, colonizers, missionaries, bureaucrats and the general public whose racism would not be part and parcel of certain philosophical principles, but would rest solely on factually false assumptions and beliefs about or contemptuous disregard for certain varieties of humankind. As a consequence, their accounts would neither follow from philosophical principles nor have the philosophically effective character he attributes to them.

So Eze too must isolate racial accounts allegedly affiliated with philosophical principles from politically rooted racial accounts in order for both his version and his critique of modern philosophy to take hold. His own indictment against modern philosophy’s complicity with invidious uses of race requires by design an argument that still upholds the autonomy of philosophy to continue tackling matters that arise internally in its domain of inquiry, despite his claim to the contrary that the “disciplinary prejudice separating cultural studies and philosophy [needs to be] overcome” (19). This point is not altogether clear in his book because, at times, he claims intellectual processes other than philosophy fashioned the modern idea of race and, at other times, he claims philosophy cognitively formed that modern idea.

Nonetheless Eze’s version as well as stock versions of modern philosophy would maintain that philosophy tackles issues that arise internally in its domain of inquiry. And, for Eze, race has so arisen and does so arise. It has not been extraneous to that domain, as the stock versions would have it. Hence, as he sees the matter, it is incumbent on philosophers to show how racial theories have been rendered as philosophical rationales for the subordination of non-European others and have been central and widespread in the history of modern philosophy. But racial theories as political rationales for such subordination have been central and widespread throughout Europe and its history as well. Indeed Eze does contend that racial theories have had brutal political consequences. Still such a contention is out of place and rather anodyne in comparison with the twofold aim of his book – (a) to show the philosophical underpinnings of racial theories emerging out of modern philosophy’s examination of humankind and (b) to make it legitimately possible for philosophy, given its history, to account for the manifold experiences of a humanly diverse world without the use of race.

As I stated earlier, modern philosophy, Eze claims, made the study of “man” or humankind its primary focus. Such an examination brought modern philosophy in conjunction with anthropology, and anthropology organized then the recently available information about certain varieties of humankind, non-Europeans in general and Africans in particular, for inquisitive scholarly and philosophical minds. Although the incipient anthropology produced was at its root “physical” rather than “cultural,” “geographical” rather than “ethnographical,” Eze finds Hume’s naturalism appropriate for displaying this conjunction and suitable to underwrite philosophically the racial theory Hume endorses.

Eze’s argument here is quite tight and very plausible. Hume himself explicitly asserts that he seeks to establish a “science of man” to “explain the principles of human nature.” Hume admits to nature’s “original distinction” between “breeds of men” as the distinction between the “inferior” breeds of men (especially “the Negro”), which are “non-white,” and the “eminent” breed, which is “white.” He admits to the “uniformity and constancy” of nature’s distinction, such that they extend even to the intellectual and moral aptitudes of humankind. Engaging in comparison, specifically when the objects of comparison are not present, is an intellectual aptitude, an aptitude of reason, enhanced in the “white” breed of men to the point that the establishment of arts and sciences flourishes, but diminished in “non-white” breeds to the point that the establishment of arts and sciences is non-existent. The natural propensity to sympathize with others is a moral aptitude that could serve as the basis for a common humanity or “a union of certain affections with each other in the inferior species of creatures as well as in the superior.” But Hume gives, at best, trivial regard to sympathy overcoming nature’s “original distinction.” A “union of certain affections” is not a motivating impetus to fostering a common humanity, since nature’s “original distinction” denies the possibility of a common humanity. So sympathy could not override nature’s “original distinction.”

All in all, then, Hume’s racism, it can be plausibly argued, is “hardwired” to his naturalism, a conclusion that appears to support Eze’s project.

Can similar conclusions, however, be rendered for Kant? Although familiar with and, to some extent, influenced by Hume’s views on race, Kant is a pioneer in the development of scientifically grounded racial theories. Just as Kant initiated a “paradigm shift” in modern philosophy with his transcendental idealism, he also led the way in the formulation of a scientific definition of race that (a) established meticulously for the first time a lucid conceptual distinction between race and species and (b) gave further credence at the time to the postulate of the intergenerational permanence of racial traits, which, if true, would render so-called “race-mixing” impossible. As Eze points out, Kant’s racial theory, which embraced the contention that “whites” were superior to “non-whites,” was the most rigorous as well as the most fully articulated scientific contribution to racial classification, shaping the discourse on that topic as well as in the field of physical geography. Kant researched, wrote, and lectured on these “race matters” for nearly forty years, i.e., right through the “pre-critical” and “critical” periods of his philosophical development. This leads Eze to conclude quite reasonably that Kant’s racial theory comprises a significant portion of his philosophical corpus.

Furthermore Eze is of the mind that Kant’s racial theory drew on claims from his Anthropology—”what Nature makes of man” and “what man makes, can, or should make of himself”—and that those claims are reflected in arguments and principles found in each of his three Critiques. This provides Eze with the belief that Kant’s racial theory garnered or sought to garner from his idealism the philosophical grounding necessary (a) for his theory to be objective and (b) for human agency to emerge out of the state of nature in order to be morally accountable and reach self-perfection. Race is, in short, “transcendentally grounded” (82, 105). There are no good reasons for Eze to hold this belief or draw this conclusion.

Kant’s “science of racial classification” enables our encounter with racial archetypes (essences) in order to have empirical knowledge of race. If it were bound to Kant’s idealism, it would be able to yield synthetic a priori judgments about race, i.e., amplifying our empirical knowledge of race objectively without relying on our experience with race to do so. But an encounter with any archetype (essence), racial or otherwise, would be impossible to obtain if one’s science or knowledge were bound to the cognitive conditions under which race is represented and which characterize Kant’s idealism. For such an encounter, the science would have to be true and objective of race itself independent and regardless of how race is represented cognitively. Kant’s science of racial classification, then, could not be cut of the same cloth as his idealism and, hence, could not rely on the a priori conditions of human knowledge.

Furthermore Eze “color codes” Kant’s moral theory such that human agency, the competency to act and judge morally, and the capacity for self-perfection and moral progress cannot be fully extended to non-Europeans, if at all. However, despite Kant’s racial beliefs, there is no evidence that he held them on the grounds of his moral philosophy. For example, when Eze claims “Kant managed to maintain throughout a hierarchical moral interpretation of color-coded differences, grounding them not only in geography, but also in morality and metaphysics” (102), he is maintaining that what Kant’s racism denies to non-whites in the moral realm is due to or correlated with what his moral theory denies to them. This is patently false.

Kant’s racist beliefs deny to non-whites moral competency. But, from the standpoint of his moral theory, the moral law is an inevitable part of all willing by every member of the human species–non-white and white. Moral competency for Kant is the capacity to subordinate the desire for happiness to respect for the moral law. The inclination to evil is the capacity to subordinate the respect for the moral law to the desire for happiness. In both instances, the moral law is operative in willing, but in the former it operates as an unconditioned and in the latter as a conditioned ground of action or judgment. Both respect for the moral law and desire for happiness are, for Kant, irreconcilable yet determining grounds coexistent in the will of every human being, again, non-white and white. And the coexistence of such grounds can only be had through the subordination of one to the other, a subordination reliant on (practical) reason’s endorsement in either case.

Kant’s moral theory does not, as Eze maintains, attribute to non-whites an exclusive and automatic inclination to evil (98) solely by the presence of the inclination. But it does attribute such an inclination to all human beings by virtue of their rational subordination of the respect for the moral to the desire for happiness. So if non-whites were to have an automatic inclination to evil like, say, a “race of devils,” they only could have it through a rational subordination of the respective determining ground. And it can be inferred, contra Eze, that Kant’s moral theory cannot deny to non-whites moral competency, since the ground for denying moral competency would be not their lack of rationality as Eze claims. Rather it would be a species-wide impediment to the capacity to subordinate rationally one or the other of the irreconcilable determining grounds of human willing. No such impediment to that capacity is even hinted at in Kant’s moral theory.

All in all, then, Kant’s racial theories and racism are not “hardwired” to his idealism or moral theory, a conclusion that does not support Eze’s project. Eze has revealed the proliferation of racist beliefs and theories amongst philosophers of the early modern period and their impact on social and political relations in Europe and America. But, outside of Hume, he has not demonstrated that racial theorizing and racism are intrinsic to modern philosophy’s domain of inquiry or its articulation of metaphysical and moral theories.

In the case of the philosophy of “negritude” and Africana philosophy, “race matters” are very much intrinsic to their domain of inquiry and their articulation of metaphysical and moral views. Yet both the philosophy of negritude and Africana philosophy operate on an entirely different plane than modern philosophy. To speak rather sweepingly, whereas the anthropological aim of the latter was the mathematical mastery of nature or, its corollary, the satisfaction of the passions via the correct techne, or the release from “self-incurred immaturity,” the aim of the former is the framing of social relations of and for a form of life with others that is organized on the basis of expression free from symbolic and material forms of racist oppression. On the face of it, the anthropological aim of the former is not on the same footing as the latter since, in the latter case, the aim is connected to the degree to which racist oppression remains structurally present, both symbolically and materially, in historically variable social relations. Furthermore the philosophy of negritude and Africana philosophy at least presuppose, if not carry out, a reconstruction of the history of African and African-diasporic people. And that history is reconstructed as a process mediated by “race matters” in which African and African-diasporic people, individually and collectively, shape themselves in order to lift the racist veil from social relations.

The philosophy of negritude and Africana philosophy do not explicitly take critical aim at the history of modern philosophy. But they do take critical aim at philosophers, scientists, politicians, and the public writ large whose racist discourse flourished in social relations throughout American and European culture and, hence, contributed to the history of African and African-diasporic people as one mediated by “race matters.” Here Eze’s account is most effective and illuminating.

By discussing the philosophy of “negritude,” Eze does two things. He discusses a philosophy that has received little, if any, attention in the field. Just as important, he also provides Africana philosophy with a historical forbearer. Since Africana philosophy tends to have a strong “analytic” bent, it tends to frame its considerations as if it does not have a “philosophical history” and emerges all at once. In any case, Eze’s analysis of negritude and his discussion of Leopold Senghor’s and Aimé Césaire’s role in the development of negritude’s movement are sophisticated and cogent.

Briefly, negritude can be called a “black consciousness movement,” originating in the 1930’s and 40’s, with literary and aesthetic roots in the well known “Harlem Renaissance” as well as the little known “Haitian Renaissance” of the 1920’s and 1930’s. Senghor, however, gives it a philosophical orientation, arguing for a form of reason specifically African or “black,” in direct contrast to a European form. We know this as the infamous claim—”emotion is Negro as reason is Greek.” Since racism, however, denied rationality as well as culture and civilization to African and African-diasporic people, negritude was, for Senghor, “the manner of self-expression of the black character, the black world, black civilization.”

As Eze points out, this “manner of self-expression” became a “racial metaphysics,” a “metaphysics of blackness,” despite Senghor’s political intent to criticize and overthrow colonial and imperial institutions on the African continent by providing African people with the psychological wherewithal to do so as well as resist those institutions’ symbolic and material devaluation of the humanity of black people. It was not his intent to overthrow the form of rationality supposedly intrinsic to Europeans. So self-expression became for Senghor less the ability of making an inner life publicly available and more an epiphenomenon of racial archetypes or essences. (Indeed “expression” or “self-expression” could have been used to show how racism ultimately denies to non-white people not rationality per se, but inner life. If inner life is non-existent in them, nothing outer can serve as a publicly available expression of them.) As Eze notes, paradoxically negritude subscribed to the extant conundrums of racist modes of thought and expression in its attempt to overcome racism. So negritude failed in its philosophical aims.

As for Africana philosophy, Eze holds out much hope for the enterprise. It has been true to the anthropological aim mentioned above. But, in addition, it must avoid the mistakes of the philosophy of negritude by attending to the changing nature of “race matters.” This can occur only by Africana philosophy taking history seriously, not only the histories of African and African-diasporic people locally and globally, but also its own philosophical history. Keeping those histories reflectively in mind makes it possible for Africana philosophy to nullify the alleged unanism of race, while still combating racist practices and theories.

Although Eze’s attempt to weave a singular thread from early modern philosophy to Africana philosophy with the articulation of metaphysical and moral views on race does not succeed, his story is nonetheless a very persuasive one once that thread is cut.