Acquaintance, Knowledge, and Logic: New Essays on Bertrand Russell's The Problems of Philosophy

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Donovan Wishon and Bernard Linsky (eds.), Acquaintance, Knowledge, and Logic: New Essays on Bertrand Russell's The Problems of Philosophy, CSLI Publications, 2015, 277pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9781575868462.

Reviewed by Consuelo Preti, The College of New Jersey


This volume consists of papers given at a 2012 conference celebrating the centenary of the publication of Russell's The Problems of Philosophy (PP). While generally thought of as an introductory text, PP is not exactly an introduction to philosophy in the usual sense. If it is one at all, it is very much a genuinely Russellian introduction to philosophy. Arguably, however, PP's primary value is more likely to be found in its role as an indication of Russell's thought at a significant transitional intellectual period. This collection highlights not only the challenging aspects of PP as a Russellian introduction to philosophy but, more essentially, the significance of the text in an account of the development of Russell's thought and in the history of early analytic philosophy.

The 'Shilling Shocker,' as Russell called it from the start, was one of a series commissioned for the Home University Library. The series was meant to provide less academically advantaged adults of the early 1900s -- "shop assistants" (3) -- with "all the main problems in their very lowest terms" (3). Fifty volumes in the series had already appeared by the time Russell produced PP (3). Moore wrote a shocker for the same series himself (Ethics, 1912), later saying he liked it better than Principia Ethica (few agree). Whitehead did one on mathematics. Not uncharacteristically, Russell knocked out PP in roughly twelve weeks during the summer of 1911. Russell assigned most (nine) of the fifteen chapters to epistemological matters. There is no discussion of ethics or religion, although the last chapter -- "The Value of Philosophy" -- is practically mystical in its characterization of knowledge as "a form of union of Self and not-Self" (PP, 159). Even metaphysics is given somewhat short shrift.[1] Russell does, however, stay committed to his earlier Moorean-influenced 'revolutionary' move to realism: In PP, the object of knowledge is not, whatever else it is, mind-dependent.

Wittgenstein hated the Shocker.[2] Lady Ottoline Morrell inspired at least the last chapter of it, was "pleased" by it, and certainly encouraged it as a livener for her lover after the rigors of mathematical philosophy (6). Moore got notable credit again, this time for "valuable assistance from unpublished writings" of his "on the relations of sense-data to physical objects."[3]Russell himself -- after teaching all year on the Fundamental Concepts of Mathematics and Mathematical Logic, as well as proofreading the second volume of Principia Mathematica -- seems to have both mildly jeered at it (and himself) for agreeing to do this "popular" and "ordinary" philosophy ("Heaven knows how I shall manage, but I must do it as I have signed the contract" (4)). But in fact, under the auspices of a general introduction to philosophy meant to be read by milliners and hackmen, he produced a set of novel and thought-provoking epistemological views. He was, in addition, stimulated enough from the work in PP to launch (what seemed like) a promising new research program from it, one that took him from "On Matter" (1912b) andTheory of Knowledge (1913b), through "The Relation of Sense-Data to Physics (1914a)" and Our Knowledge of the External World (1914b), and onto Philosophy of Logical Atomism in 1918 (the papers by Peter Hylton, Russell Wahl, and Rosalind Carey develop the connections here).[4]

The backbone of the work in PP seems to have been initiated in a set of lectures (Russell, 1911 and 1913a) that Russell gave in Paris in March 1911. Donovan Wishon and Bernard Linsky (Chapter 1) do not mention this connection explicitly but there is a case for its plausibility (Hylton and Kevin C. Klement both note the relevance of these lectures in their contributions (25-26; 190)). In the first lecture ("Le Realisme analytique"), Russell draws a link from these newly discovered procedures of his mathematical logic to wider application to problems of philosophy, science, and common sense. Some of what Wishon and Linsky note makes up the first four chapters of PP -- which establish the central formulation of sense-data and introduce the issue of the connection between sense-data and our knowledge of material objects -- can be traced to positions Russell takes in this first Paris lecture.  This includes: (i) the commitment to realism not just with respect to the theory of knowledge but also with respect to the nature of universals; and (ii) that sense-data, and a priori knowledge of universals and logical truths, are at the root of knowledge. The second Paris lecture ("L'importance philosophique de la logistique") emphasizes a path from mathematical logic to a theory of knowledge, and contains a key Russellian distinction: knowledge of fact and logical truth (1913a, 490). This resurfaces in PP as the distinction between knowledge of things and knowledge of truths. Knowledge of things includes direct awareness of individual particulars as well as universals. Knowledge of truths is a step further -- the formulation of a judgment about what one has awareness of.

At the heart of PP, of course, is Russell's distinction between knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description (see Wishon and Linsky, Chapter 1). Knowledge by description requires knowledge of truths about the things known (purportedly) by acquaintance, which includes truths about logical principles. In this second Paris lecture, Russell also makes the connection between the principle of induction and probability that he later makes in PP (Chapter VI, citing the influence of Keynes), arguing that inductive knowledge, like all knowledge, is obtained by principles that are a priori and universal. Thus logic and mathematics -- comprising propositions that are the most general, abstract, and a priori ("pure") -- are at the heart of the nature of knowledge, because, Russell claims, these "force us to admit" a world of universals and truths which do not concern particular existence.

The more metaphysical considerations in PP concerning universals and the nature of logic are examined, by Klement, Gregory Landini, and Katarina Perovic. Landini gives a tightly constructed account of what he calls Russell's "epistemology of mathematical logic" (231). Perovic argues powerfully that a key strength of Russell's regress argument with respect to universals is that it gives today's realists another fighting corner against nominalists and trope theorists. Klement's (exceptionally elegantly written) paper is a detailed historical account of tensions in Russell's understanding of the nature of logic between 1903 and 1930. The insouciance with which Russell appears to assert, particularly in PP, that logical propositions are relations between abstract universals and that we know logical propositions via acquaintance with those universals, is, Klement notes, not easy to square with Russell's account of the nature of logical propositions in, let alone after, Principia Mathematica (which preceded PP). Things only get stickier with respect to the role of universals in logical propositions as Russell works his way toward the ultimately abandoned Theory of Knowledge project (1913b) and beyond. Klement's considerations end in an agreeable scholarly bombshell on Russell's seemingly paradoxical thinking on the nature of logic (226): "that logic seems at once to have no specific subject matter and that this therefore is its subject matter."

It should be clear by now that PP (especially considered as an intro text) is not for the faint of heart. Wishon and Linsky press, for instance, the claim that the central discussion of sense-data initiates a series of controversial connections to Cartesian foundationalism, the nature of a priori knowledge, our knowledge of universals, and our knowledge of physical objects in particular (6-7). The argument concerning the construction of matter from sense-data introduces Russell's version of structuralism in physics, but can look mystifying (see the paper by Wahl). And as for knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description, the distinction has its trials. It is far from obvious that beginners in philosophy can be made to understand Russell's philosophical advance with respect to descriptions (let alone care). In addition, it cannot quite be said that the nature of acquaintance has ever quite been thrashed out to anybody's satisfaction. But Russell's concept of acquaintance is a significant link between his rebellion from idealism along with Moore circa 1900, and the new, more epistemological direction that began just before PP and more or less came to end around 1918. I will focus here a bit more on the Russellian notion of acquaintance given its prominent role in many of the papers in this volume.

One puzzle: The classic epistemological problem that Russell appears to introduce in the first few lines of PP (7) -- "Is there any knowledge in the world which is so certain that no reasonable man could doubt it?" -- seems clear enough; but, as Wishon and Linsky argue, appears somewhat complicated by the appearance of the discussion concerning inductive knowledge and probability in Chapter VI. Russell argues that inductive knowledge is no less derived from a priori and universal logical principles as is deductive knowledge. The editors claim, however, that this chapter sits uneasily with what looks like a line of argument, developed across the first four chapters, that we can have direct and certain knowledge based on acquaintance with our sense-data (11-12). And this, in turn, introduces a scholarly dispute over the shift that Russell makes from earlier claims concerning the kinds of entities that we are acquainted with, as well as what acquaintance gets us, epistemologically speaking. For instance, as Ian Proops (Chapter 3) and Linsky (Chapter 4) argue, it is less than clear that Russell's claim that we have direct acquaintance with sense-data allows for -- let alone entails -- an argument against skepticism in line with a canonical Cartesian foundationalism.

Russell's arguments concerning a priori knowledge -- which introduce his position on universals and our knowledge (by acquaintance) of them -- raises even more questions, which Hylton takes on in his contribution. As Russell argues, a priori knowledge concerns entities that do not, as he puts it, "properly speaking, exist, either in the mental or in the physical world." But Russell also appears to want to argue that all knowledge is based on a priori and universal principles, including inductive knowledge (as above); and (as Hylton notes (32-33)), our knowledge or material objects. So, for instance: Tables exist in the physical world, but our sense-data of them don't, in PP. We do have reason to believe that there are physical objects like tables -- it's the simplest hypothesis, and the one that organizes the manifold, so to speak, into something like a science -- but we still need an account of how we know truths about physical objects; indeed, how we can think about them at all (32). This rests on an account of a priori knowledge, itself in turn explained in terms of our acquaintance with universals. But as Hylton argues (38-39), not only is the notion of acquaintance with universals less than well drawn, it's not at all clear how it is supposed to explain the a priori principles that purport to govern our knowledge of physical objects.

One of Hylton's emphases in particular is a tension that he argues is identifiable in Russell's views on the nature of acquaintance and what, in particular, we are acquainted with.[5] Hylton draws a predictably faultless historical and contextual line to the theses in PP in the development of Russell's epistemological views, going back to "On Denoting" (1905) and the Paris lectures of 1911, and through to "The Nature of Sense-Data" and "On Matter," which Russell finished after the summer of 1911 (when he wrote PP). In Principles of Mathematics, Russell took it that we were acquainted with lots of entities, including Homeric gods and material objects. By 1905, however, he denied that we can be acquainted with matter ("in the sense in which matter occurs in physics"). This raises the question, of course, as to the relation of sense-data and matter (surely our initial epistemological access to material objects is via the senses); as well as the issue concerning the nature of sense-data themselves (are they material?). One problem is that on Russell's view, we appear to have knowledge by acquaintance with sense-data; but this does not apply to matter. Hylton argues that if we have knowledge by description of matter, a tension arises. Knowledge by description involves propositions (judgments). Russell's earlier view -- Moore's (1899) -- was that we have direct acquaintance with propositions and their constituents. But in PP, he introduces (another version of) the Multiple Relation Theory of Judgment -- and on this theory, there are no propositions. Hence the problem Hylton identifies concerning our knowledge of material or physical objects. We are not acquainted with them; but apparently we can't be acquainted with propositions about them either, on the view defended in PP.

Hylton's discussion, I would note, also indirectly raises the issue of Moore's and Russell's mutual influence during this period of their intellectual development. In summer 1911, Moore had not yet taken up his lectureship at Cambridge, but he had given a set of lectures at Morley College London in Autumn 1910 and Spring 1911. Moore's lectures (Moore 1953) include "What is Philosophy"; "Sense-Data"; "Propositions"; "Ways of Knowing"; and "Material Things". These are the lectures that Russell credits unrestrainedly in the preface to PP. One notable thing about this work is that Moore appears to do an about face on the existence of propositions between the 1910 lectures and those of 1911. Moore further added to the confusion later (1942) by denying that he meant to deny the existence of propositions. So one question that arises from Hylton's paper here is: How much of what Moore was thinking about on sense-data, propositions, and acquaintance was transmitted to Russell?

Michael Kremer's genial consideration of Russell's notion of acquaintance begins by noting something often unremarked: that Russell's notion of acquaintance appears to distort an ordinary notion of acquaintance. Russell plumped for 'acquaintance' rather than 'presentation' as the term of choice, arguing that 'acquaintance' better emphasized the relational character of the direct cognitive awareness of an object that it was meant to capture. But oddly, as Kremer notes, Russell's term of art ends up ruling out the most natural fit for it: the acquaintance we have withother people. Kremer cites for instance "On Fundamentals" (CPBR, vol. 4, 359-413), where Russell denies that we have a direct cognitive awareness of another person. Russell asserts there that we have, at most, acquaintance with their "sensible manifestations". Moreover, "what we like" is their sensible manifestations (though even Russell rules out, mercifully, the other possibility: that "what we like" is "the concepts denoting them"). As Kremer remonstrates, however, this amounts to a denial of affectionate relations toward other people (135). If this is what follows from Russell's theory of knowledge, perhaps it's that theory that has to go.

Kremer "sketches" a better conception of knowledge of and love for other people (140-41) by first arguing that the concept of an organic unity -- mostly denied, as he notes, by Russell and by Moore in their early work -- is adaptable to it. He adds to this the formulation by Eleonore Stump (2010) that a "second-person" experience -- the kind captured by referring to another as "you" -- is an experience that generates knowledge of another person ruled out in a third-person, knowledge-that conception of knowledge (141). This second-person knowledge can be conveyed by "narrative"; it is holistic knowledge (it is of a unity of some kind); and it is a conception that can sustain the notion of degrees of knowledge of another person. Importantly, for Kremer's argument, this conception is neither propositional (knowledge-that) nor is it knowledge of things. It is another way to understand knowledge by acquaintance, in an emotionally richer understanding of the concept: "it is other people that are given to me, presented to me in my experience, as unities that confront me with the task of deepening my knowledge of them." Russell's conception makes this sound like a tedious chore: Other persons are constructions out of immediate data, which are inferred and not directly known; it is also not clear who they are. By 1918 Russell is saying things like "you have got to find some correlations among the appearances which are of the sort that make you put all those appearances together and say, they are the appearances of one person" (Kremer, 148). One is tempted to say, very uncharitably, that if this is knowledge of others, it may well be that Russell was pretty bad at it.[6]

I will end here by noting what might be a slight irony concerning Russell's formulation of acquaintance. Moore's Principia Ethica is, overall, largely taken to have failed to establish, by way of his own arguments, anything like the conclusions that he sought to determine. But few bother to deny outright Moore's conception of the Ideal, or the Ultimate Good: "By far the most valuable things, which we know or can imagine are certain states of consciousness, which may be roughly described as the pleasures of human intercourse and the enjoyment of beautiful objects." In addition, Moore's personal qualities were often, warmly, and ecstatically extolled by Russell and the rest of his friends -- even Wittgenstein. Add to this that Moore himself had defended a prototype notion of acquaintance in his earliest work, which had had that revolutionary impact on Russell. So perhaps we might wonder how it is that with all the lifelong heartfelt sincerity that characterized Russell's appreciation of Moore, Russell's own formulation of acquaintance is as tone-deaf to the natural understanding of the concept as Kremer here intriguingly argues that it is. Fortunately, however, this volume contains enough material to satisfy anybody's pursuit for acquaintance and knowledge of Russell's philosophical deliberations on these subjects, and more.


Bosanquet, B. 1912. "Review of The Problems of Philosophy," Mind (n.s. 21), (No. 84): 556-64.

Dawes Hicks, G. 1912. "The Nature of Sense-Data," Mind, (n.s. 21), (No. 83): 399-409.

Eames, E. and K. Blackwell. 1984. The Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell (CPBR), Vol. 7. London: Allen and Unwin.

Moore, G.E. 1899. "The Nature of Judgment," Mind (n.s. 8), No. 30: 176-193.

Moore, G.E. 1903. Principia Ethica. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Moore, G.E. 1912. Ethics. London: Williams and Norgate (The Home University Library).

Moore. G.E. 1953. Some Main Problems of Philosophy. London: Muirhead Library of Philosophy.

McGuinness, B. and G.H. von Wright. 1995. Ludwig Wittgenstein: Cambridge Letters. Oxford: Blackwell.

Monk, R. 1996. Bertrand Russell: The Spirit of Solitude. London: Jonathan Cape.

Potter, M. 2009. Wittgenstein's Notes on Logic. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Russell, B. 1910-1911. "Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description," Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 108-28.

Russell, B. 1903. The Principles of Mathematics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Russell, B. 1905. "On Denoting," Mind (n.s. 14), No. 56: pp. 479-493.

Russell, B. 1911. "Analytic Realism." In CPBR Vol. 6 (132-146).

Russell, B. 1912a. The Problems of Philosophy. London: Williams and Norgate (The Home University Library).

Russell, B. 1912b. "On Matter." In CPBR Vol. 6 (77-95).

Russell, B. 1913a. "The Philosophical Importance of Mathematical Logic." The Monist (23): 481-93.

Russell, B. 1913b. Theory of Knowledge: The 1913 Manuscript (in CPBR, Vol. 7).

Russell, B. 1913c. "The Nature of Sense-Data: A Reply to Dr. Dawes Hicks." Mind (n.s. 22), 76-81.

Russell, B. 1914a. "The Relation of Sense-Data to Physics," in Russell, 1918.

Russell, B. 1914b. Our Knowledge of the External World. London: George Allen and Unwin.

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[1] "I couldn't say much about metaphysics because so little of it seems to me true." (CPBR Vol. 6: xlii).

[2] And might have been snarky about it in a letter he wrote to Russell concerning complexes and copulae (dated by Russell as Summer 1912): "There is nothing more wonderful in the world than the true problems of Philosophy" (McGuinness and von Wright, 17-18).

[3] Bernard Bosanquet states in his review of PP (1912) that his "attitude to it . . . must be hostile"; mostly, it seems, because Russell refused to acknowledge that idealism was the better position. George Dawes Hicks (1912) also reviewed PP, and earned for himself the derisive characterization of "muddle-headed" on sense-data from Russell. The muddle made Wittgenstein "quite ill. He declaimed for a long time and I thought he would murder me!" (Potter 2012, 31). See Russell (1913c) for his own reply.

[4] Barnard (Chapter 8) argues that there is a connection to be made between the approaches in PP and the Theory of Knowledge manuscript (which he suggests can be considered a "minimal analytic phenomenology" (165)), and the early phenomenology of Husserl. Russell does appear to have intended to review Husserl's Logische Untersuchungen, but did not. He wrote to Husserl in 1920 to say so, but he did not say why he did not complete the review. Russell also passingly praised Husserl's anti-psychologism in his (1928). There is no substantive textual evidence, however, that Russell ever engaged deeply with Husserlian phenomenology.

[5] Proops (Chapter 3), for his part, definitively dissolves, in convincing detail, any support for Geach's not infrequently accepted view that Russell's denial of acquaintance with material objects is motivated by some kind of Cartesian doubt with respect to material objects and other people.

[6] Ray Monk (1996) certainly paints that picture.