Acting Out

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Bernard Stiegler, Acting Out, David Barison, Daniel Ross, and Patrick Crogan (trans.), Stanford University Press, 2009, 93pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780804758697.

Reviewed by Jeffrey T. Nealon, Penn State University


Acting Out consists of a very fine translation of two brief 2003 books by French philosopher and social critic Bernard Stiegler: Passer à l'acte, which is translated under the title "How I Became a Philosopher"; and Aimer, s'aimer, nous aimer: Du 11 septembre au 21 avril, which is rendered here as "To Love, to Love Me, to Love Us: From September 11 to April 21." "How I Became a Philosopher" is an account of just that, a memoir of Stiegler's "passage to the act" of philosophy, with special emphasis on his five years of imprisonment for armed robbery (1978-83), where he first began this difficult passage. This text is a lyrical, elliptical, and philosophically rich recounting of Stiegler's own transformation, under the most dire conditions, in and through the practices of thinking.

"To Love" is a very different kind of text, a piece of social criticism that takes the form of an extended meditation on what Stiegler calls the "loss of individuation" (39) under contemporary consumption capitalism, pointing out the toxic, violent effects of de-individuation for both the individual and the community (or, in Stiegler's preferred Hegelian vocabulary, the "I" and the "we"). The "April 21" of the title references the 2002 murder of eight city council members in Nanterre, carried out by Richard Durn, a man who, as Stiegler puts it, "suffered terribly from not existing, from not having, he said, a 'feeling of existing'" (39). Because he could not affirm himself, he did not feel individuated, and therefore he could not love others:

Richard Durn, failing to develop his narcissism [here, a positive sense of individuation, an "I that is a we"], saw in the municipal council the reality of an alterity that made him suffer, that did not return to him any image, and he massacred it … Now, if I no longer love myself, I no longer love others, since others are nothing more than the mirror of my self-love: in this consists primordial narcissism. From the moment that I no longer love myself and no longer love others, all transgression becomes possible: there is no longer any limit to my action, which means my action may become a passage to the act of pure madness. (40-41)

As Bob Dylan puts it, "when you ain't got nothing, you got nothing to lose."

Stiegler here argues vigorously for the necessity of a process of individuation (not to be confused with individualism), beginning in a primordial narcissism (which is not to be confused with Freud's primary narcissism -- "me, me, me" being precisely the opposite of Stiegler's notion of the "I that is a we"). Though Stiegler doesn't talk specifically about mourning and melancholia in Freud when making his points, it seems to me the distinction is a live and pertinent one for describing his work (and one assumes his translators think so as well, which might explain the title of the collection): while mourning is a critical, philosophical process of working through loss and its meaning for the individual and the collective, melancholia is a sometimes violent atheoretical acting out over a loss that can be neither accurately named nor mourned. It is this "acting out" which Stiegler diagnoses as the fate of the Richard Durns in a world like ours. Stiegler's "passage to the act" is, I take it, his version of a certain mournful philosophizing, one that takes as its primary target and adversary the madness of melancholic "acting out" over unnamable loss.

Clearly, there's something very pressing in all this. The very week I finished this review, Jiverly Wong, a 41-year-old Asian immigrant in New York, supposedly upset at his infelicity with English and his subsequent difficulties in finding a job, walked into an Immigration Center in Binghamton and killed himself, but not before killing thirteen other people just like himself -- new arrivals to the US, awaiting and desiring citizenship. He could affirm no common link between his suffering and the suffering of those others, in exactly the same position. So he acted out in a terrifying way.

Given that Stiegler has identified a crucial social problem, we're then led to ask: What are the primary causes which lead to such a violent lashing out against the other, which is also a lashing out against the self? For better or worse, Stiegler gives a very consistent answer to that question in Acting Out: the misery of our time is caused by what he calls the "technics" of consumption capitalism. He writes,

The question of the articulation of the I and the we is overdetermined by that of technics. This has always been the case, but in the past it was not perceived. It became perceivable in the nineteenth century and above all in the twentieth, when industrial objects appeared systematically in the form of new objects dedicated to replacing preceding ones. This is what we call consumption [consommation]. Now, each day, hundreds of patents are lodged around the world, from which result innumerable new objects, which must be adopted and which make us adopt them. Marketing, the media, systems of behavioral synchronization, which serve to more or less artificially "sustain" consumption, are technologies of adoption: they make us adopt a new toothpaste, a new washing powder, a new type of mobile phone, a new optional standard in cars. We must consume in order for the economic machine of the global we to function … Today, the specific and specifically miserable trait of our epoch is that the articulation of the I and the we is hegemonically submitted to the imperative to adopt the new, according to the mode of consumption. (43-44)

There are myriad critical or laudatory things that one could say about such a diagnosis of the present, but rather than come right out and say them, I'd prefer here to try to articulate a bit more precisely what you have to accept in order to find Stiegler's analysis of the present compelling or convincing. What philosophy do you have to hold in order "to pass to the act" of such an analysis of contemporary culture?

First and foremost, to find Stiegler's analysis persuasive, you have to accept a version of late capitalism and the role of the culture industry that makes Adorno's work on the topic look positively sunny by comparison. At least Adorno had positive things to say about the modes of dialectical response potentially provoked by the Circus or the Marx Brothers; but for Stiegler "all incommensurability … has been suppressed" (71) by the contemporary culture industry and its hyper-standardization. To accept Stiegler's analysis of the present, in other words, you have to agree that engagement with popular culture is inherently lobotomizing -- that there is no possible resistant response to the present unless one escapes or denies it altogether. Under contemporary consumption capitalism, Stiegler argues that

you are locked into your synchronicity, prevented from changing, and, through this, what is pursued amounts to a hypersegmentation, a marketing strategy for identifying ultraprecise niches. This is how behavior is standardized, reduced to socio-professional categories … This control of retentional systems where consciousness is a market, where an hour of consciousness is worth the sum of advertising receipts divided by the number of viewers, has the effect of homogenizing secondary retention. And this is an essential cause (if not the only cause) of what I call ill-being. The control of retention implies the loss of identity, that is, of difference. (76)

Again, one may or may not find this kind of argument persuasive (I'll be quick to say that I don't in the least), but in order to find it so, you need to accept Stiegler's vision of the contemporary world as a kind of hyper-Heideggerian realm of inauthenticity, where a techne-driven instrumental rationality has tightly enframed the whole world, leaving us staring down at nothing but a global monoculture of empty consumerism: "this system engenders herd behavior and not, contrary to legend, individual behavior" (48). And for Stiegler's work to work, you likewise have to hold confidence in the Heideggerian solution: that the proper mode of resistance to a fallen, valueless world from which the gods have flown is a revitalized individuation technique, the re-invention of both a modernist critical distance and a poetic relation between us and the world in which we live -- what Robert Bernasconi calls the "building, dwelling, fishing" reading of Heidegger. As Stiegler writes, "When I watch the television news each day at the same time with around fifteen million people in France, a synchronization of the I is produced that is no longer the care of an I or of an ensemble of Is in the interior of a we, but the confusion of Is and the we, totalitarianism as the elimination of the differences of the I and the we, in what a German has called 'das Man'" (80). In short, for Stiegler, we are all dupes for the system -- well, I guess not all of us, as somebody's got to play authentic Dasein to everyone else's das Man. In any case, we have met Stiegler's enemies, and they are the Channel 6 Action News Team.

Given this kind of analysis, it's not clear to me what Stiegler adds to a very orthodox and old-fashioned reading of Heidegger -- it seems to me that this is merely an updating of the Heideggerian worry that the radio, corporate farming, and recorded music standardize us all into a homogeneous, dis-enchanted mass of non-individuals. Stiegler's analysis of the present, especially of television and the culture industries, is positively antiquarian, or at least it shows no evidence of having worked through 40+ years of work in cultural studies, much of it inspired by the Birmingham School. Virtually all work in cultural studies begins from the premise that the late capitalist consumer -- which is to say, each and every one of us -- is not simply a passive receptor for standardizing social messages and dictates.

Likewise, such jeremiads against consumerism seem to me to fall flat as critical analyses of the present. Given all the problems that surround and implicate contemporary capitalism (and they are myriad, not the least of which being the simple fact that several billion people on the planet live in crippling poverty), it's hard for me to swallow the argument that the primary calamity of our time is the loss of common cultural values and their replacement by an empty, television-driven consumerism. In short, I find it hard to mourn what Stiegler calls "the destruction of modes of collective life" -- "familial," "national," or "religious" -- by "the great televisual consumption system" (50): something had to destroy the stifling patriarchal family, the racist cold war nation-state, and the moralistic religiosity of the early and middle 20th century. So if television did it, I tip my hat to television -- though I would think various collective civil rights, immigrants', women's, and workers' movements had something to do with its demise as well.

I guess the primary question I have for an analysis like Stiegler's concerns whether the only way forward is backward. Is the primary affect of our world really an intense suffering brought on by television and subjective standardization? Is it really all sad passions all the time -- "knowledge is essentially a lack, just as every object of desire is a lack" (8)? In the end, in responding to whatever the challenges of the present might be, must one reinvent the categories of collectivity and agency based on a 19th century scaffolding -- an enchanted world of "gods," "families," and "values," reinscribed within a thoroughly modernist notion of identity (Hegel's "I that is a we and the we that is an I")? Ironically, the ascetic portrait of prison life in part I of Acting Out (Stiegler's "How I Became a Philosopher") comes out looking a whole lot better than the world of everyday consumerist life portrayed in part II's "To Love." That, I think, should give us pause. But in the end, even if one accepts Stiegler's dire version of the Heideggerian Gestell thesis concerning the present -- even if we are indeed "stupefied by marketing and the media" (33) -- aren't there nevertheless myriad new possibilities and lines of flight that are made possible in and through these transformations of the socius?