Action and Its Explanation

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Ruben, David-Hillel, Action and Its Explanation, Oxford, 2003, 229pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0198235887.

Reviewed by Ausonio Marras, University of Western Ontario


In this book Ruben challenges two main versions of the widely held causal theory of action and argues that the category of action is primitive and cannot be reconstructed in terms of such categories as event and causation. He also outlines a counterfactual theory of causal explanation that makes no commitment to the existence of laws, and holds that at least some explanations of action are causal.

The first two chapters (which occupy about one third of the book) set out the “metaphysical preliminaries”. Chapter 1 offers a version of the “prolific” theory of action individuation, counting the bending of my finger (as I pull the trigger to kill the Queen) as distinct from the action of killing the Queen, and locating the latter at the time and place of the Queen’s death – contrary to “austere” theories (like Davidson’s) that identify the two actions and locate them at the time and place of the finger bending. The consequence of this way of counting actions – that, for example, I killed the Queen at distant Balmoral, where she died, six months after I shot her in London, and (suppose) three months after I myself died – is, Ruben argues, not only no more paradoxical than the austere view’s consequence that the Queen was killed in London six months before she died in Balmoral, but its paradoxical appearance can be explained away by extending Peter Geach’s familiar distinction between real changes and mere “Cambridge” changes to actions: my bending my finger is a real action, but my killing the Queen is a Cambridge action, one that only attributes a Cambridge change to me – the sort of change that Napoleon undergoes in being eulogized by Chirac, or that Adam and Eve undergo in gaining another remote descendant. As these examples show, one need not exist at p at t in order to have or acquire a property at p at t: “posthumous predication” is not as puzzling as might seem. However, if by posthumous predication I may be credited with the delayed action of killing the Queen at a time and place when and where I am not, why can’t my original, long past action of bending my finger (or pulling the trigger, or shooting the Queen) similarly be credited with acquiring the delayed property of being a killing, as some “austere” theorists (Davidson, Bennett, etc.) have suggested? Ruben admits it could, but to allow a shooting to become a killing is to countenance a Cambridge meta-event, and thus to overpopulate our ontology to no advantage. Perhaps so; but there seems to be something unsettling about the very idea of a Cambridge action, with its suggestion that it is somehow not a “real” action (the way a Cambridge change is not a “real” change). Unlike Adam’s and Eve’s acquiring a remote descendant, or Napoleon being eulogized now – events on which Adam and Napoleon had no say – my killing of the Queen was as real an action as was my pulling the trigger with murderous intentions. Indeed, it is difficult to see why I would be held accountable for it unless the killing was intimately related to my wounding the Queen at the place and time of my shooting her – a wounding that turned out to be mortal; and that “intimate relation” surely was not a causal one, for my wounding her did not cause my killing her, though it caused her death. If the relation between the wounding (or the shooting) and the killing was not a causal one, what was it? The only remotely plausible answers would seem to be: either the relation of identity or the relation of “becoming”: the wounding was a killing, or it became a killing. But it’s hard to see how an event (or action) can become another event (or action), except in the sense that it “turned out to be” a certain way: and that just means that it (the wounding) later came to merit a new and more appropriate characterization (as a killing). In other words, the Queen’s death made it true that the wounding was a mortal one, i.e., a killing – just as the “austere” theory would have it.

In chapter 2 various other distinctions are made: in particular, the distinction between action and activity (the latter, like house-cleaning, having a plurality of actions as constituents), basic and non-basic actions, mental and physical actions, and, prominently, the distinction between an action and the event “intrinsic” to it. An action (e.g. my killing of the Queen) logically entails an event intrinsic to it (the Queen’s death) but is never, even at the token level, identical with it: first, because the action and its intrinsic event “have different subjects” (the Queen’s death happens only to her, the killing involves both her and me), and second, because the action and the event have different properties, including different causal properties (the killing was culpable, the death was not; the death was partly caused by blood-letting, the killing was not, etc.). One might wonder how these reasons help us distinguish a (token) “basic” action from the (token) event intrinsic to it, e.g., my raising my arm on a given occasion from my arm rising on that occasion: both concern me and my arm, and both seem to have the same causal and other properties (e.g. they have the same space-time location, both are caused by my intention to signal, both cause the same air molecules to be displaced, etc.). These are unsurprising facts for “austere” theories that count my raising my arm and my arm rising as the same (token) event. But on Ruben’s account it turns out that basic actions are not to be identified with their intrinsic event for the simple but surprising reason, spelled out in Chapter 5, that basic actions have no events intrinsic to them. More on this later. The important point about basic actions in this chapter is that their basicness is not absolute (i.e., pertaining to an action type) but relative to an “action chain” generated by the by relation: for example, bending my finger on a given occasion is basic relative to a chain that also includes my pulling the trigger, my shooting the gun, my killing the Queen, etc., where each action on the chain is done by doing its predecessor, until we get to my bending my finger, which (in this case) is done directly, not by doing anything else. It turns out, unsurprisingly, that no basic actions are mere Cambridge actions: all basic actions are real (p. 69). It also turns out, contrary to the volitional theory, that not all basic actions are mental actions: my bending my finger – a basic action on the previous chain – is surely a physical action.

Chapters 3-5 describe and criticize three “folk-naturalist” theories of action: the “currently orthodox” causal theory (CTA), and two versions of the “agent-causal” theory. (“Folk naturalism”, a form of philosophical naturalism, attempts to reconstruct folk-talk about action and agency using concepts such as ’event’ and ’causation’ which are “ultimately acceptable or available to the natural sciences”; p. 82). After briefly describing the three theories and identifying a crucial assumption they all share (that each basic action is identical to an “intrinsic event”), chapter 3 focuses on the CTA – roughly the sort of theory espoused by Davidson, Goldman, Brand, etc. What CTA claims is that “a movement of X’s body, m, is X’s basic action iff m is rationalized and caused in the right way by X’s mental states” (p. 85). CTA thus identifies every (token) basic action with its intrinsic event – my bending my finger with my finger’s bending, when this has a rationalizing mental cause (a belief-desire pair or an intention or an action plan, etc.). It also views non-basic actions (my pulling the trigger, my shooting the Queen, etc.) as events caused by (or, on the “austere” view, identical with) an agent’s basic action. On CTA’s folk-naturalistic account, then, “there is no ontological divide between actions and events, between activity and passivity” (p. 86): “bodily events with the right rationalizing mental state causal ancestry are, on this view, actions” (p. 89). But crucial to the ensuing critique of CTA in chapter 4 is the “rationalizing requirement”, which commits CTA “to finding … some mental occurrences that cause and rationalize each token action” (p. 98). This, Ruben objects, requires of agents “an implausibly rich mental life … CTA is engaged in dramatic mental overpopulation. It overintellectualizes action” (p. 98). Why does Ruben think so?

The case is argued in detail in chapter 4. Rationalizing requires not only desires (or intentions) but also beliefs, for in order to rationalize an action I must believe that by performing it I will do or obtain something I desire. Some CTA theorists (e.g. Goldman) hold that, in order to cause action, the rationalizing beliefs and desires have to be occurrent (actually present to consciousness), not merely dispositional; but, Ruben objects, “in very many cases of action, careful introspection … fails to provide evidence of such conscious beliefs and desires” (p. 117). Even if, pace Goldman, we include dispositional (as well as unconscious or subconscious) beliefs and desires among the ones available to CTA (the only restriction being that they must in principle be available to consciousness), “there will still be insufficient mental material … to make the CTA plausible” (p. 119). For there are ubiquitous cases of genuinely intentional action for which “the agent has no rationalizing mental states (in particular, no beliefs) whose propositional content matches the action description” (p. 126). Such are the actions involved in many kinds of routine or skilled activity, or in the exercise of an art or craft – for example in shaving, ice-skating, painting, dancing, hugging, riding a bicycle, eating. Even though the whole activities, or the decision to engage in them, may involve some degree of strategy or planning, CTA “is meant to apply to all our actions, even to those actions that are parts of other actions”: my pulling the razor in some particular way while shaving, my twisting my body this way or that in dancing, etc. If I believed that by pulling the razor that way I would shave off some of my whiskers, the belief would rationalize the pulling: “But of course I may not have, and typically do not have, any such beliefs. The CTA founders … on many of these actions that are parts of longer stretches of activity requiring technique” (p. 129). Such actions are part of intelligent activity that merely requires “know how” very much in the Rylean sense that no rationalizing mental episodes are required to causally account for the performance of the constitutive actions.

Is Ruben’s case against CTA successful? He responds to a number of objections later in the chapter, but lingering doubts remain. First, one might argue that Ruben’s argument does not strike at the heart of CTA, whose essential concern, arguably, is to establish the thesis that those actions for which we do have rationalizing beliefs and desires can and, indeed, must be caused by them, if the rationalizing states are to be genuinely explanatory. A paramount motivating factor behind CTA from the very beginning (e.g. in the work of Donald Davidson) was to respond to the teleologists’ claim that “reasons can’t be causes”. Those (routine or skilful) actions which, like pulling the razor in some particular way, are not “done for a reason” (beyond the reason that rationalizes the activity of which they are constitutive) may well fall outside the scope of CTA if they can simply be accounted for in terms of Rylean “knowledge-how”. It seems compatible with CTA to suppose that, e.g., a skilled activity like shaving is caused by reasons even if it recruits routines and subroutines that do not themselves require independent rationalization. (Ruben rejects this suggestion insisting that the constituent parts of the activities in question are fully intentional actions requiring, according to CTA, their own rationalizing causes: to suppose that they can be rationalized simply as means to the larger end would require revising CTA in unacceptable ways.) Alternatively, one might argue that Ruben takes too narrow a view of what the rationalizing causes can be. Though pulling the razor in some particular way does not require an occurrent or even a dispositional belief (namely the belief that by pulling the razor that way I would effectively rid myself of some whiskers), it may require that I dispositionally have such a belief (cf. Robert Audi’s distinction between “dispositional beliefs” and “dispositions to believe” – a distinction that Ruben stresses and exploits in this book). Ruben objects that a belief I dispositionally have, unlike a “stored” dispositional belief which is retrievable and potentially present to consciousness, needs to be “formed” or “computed” from other general information that is stored or even hard-wired in me in some way. However, why should it make any substantive difference to CTA whether certain beliefs or other informational states are occurrent, dispositional (“stored”), or merely dispositionally had or physically hard-wired? (E.g. the question in cognitive science whether rules are stored in memory as data-structures or whether they are merely hard-wired is often regarded as a red herring.) Perhaps Ruben’s point is that mere dispositions to believe can’t rationalize actions, for “mere physical abilities and dispositions have no place in the folk-psychological arena” (p. 134). But why not, as long as the dispositions are individuated folk-psychologically, as dispositions to have such and such rationalizing beliefs? Ruben implies that such individuation is not possible, for the dispositions in question are “subpersonal”, neurophysiological states of a system encoding information that is inaccessible to the agent (cf. p. 134). But this is like saying that solubility has no place in folk-physics because that disposition is realized by microstates of a system whose informational content is inaccessible to the common folk.

The case against CTA is completed in chapter 4 with a discussion of mental action, where it is argued that CTA cannot give a convincing account of certain (“spontaneous”) cases of it. Chapter 5 turns to the second main type of causal theory of action, the “agent-causation” theory, of which two versions are considered and rejected: one, which identifies an action with an intrinsic event caused by the agent himself; the other, which identifies an action with the causing by the agent of an event intrinsic to the action. The first is found wanting because it “attempts to explain the less mysterious [action] by the more mysterious [agent-causality]” (p. 174); the second, because it is committed to a “reification of causings” (p. 166), and such entities or events are problematic (e.g. can causings be caused?). But the more interesting and controversial move in this chapter is Ruben’s rejection of the previously mentioned assumption shared by both versions of the agent causation theory as well as by CTA: “that there is an event intrinsic to every basic action” (p. 175). There are, Ruben acknowledged earlier, events that are intrinsic to (though distinct from) non-basic actions; but when it comes to a basic action, “no event intrinsic to that action [let alone identical to it] occurs … [W]hen X moves his hand, there is in one sense no such event at all as his hand moving. All that there is, is the action” (p. 177). As Ruben admits, this claim may be met with incredulity: “Is it really false that when I move my hand my hand moves”? (p. 178). Well, it is in one sense – a sense that warrants an exclusive disjunction in the case of basic actions: “either a person moves his hand or his hand moves. The first is an action; the second a (mere) event” (p. 177). But then, one may well protest, in that sense of ’event’ (as “mere event”) the claim is hardly surprising but actually quite trivial: since a “mere event” is, by definition, a non-action – an occurrence lacking an intentional cause or explanation – the claim is just that when a person performs a basic action, an event has occurred which is not a non-action (a “mere event”). Ruben’s metaphysical motivation for his thesis however, is far from trivial: it is to ground the idea that the category of action is irreducible to that of (mere?) event, since activity cannot be reduced to passivity.

In the sixth and final chapter Ruben sketches a counterfactual theory of causal explanation, along the lines of his 1990 book (Explaining Explanation, Routledge), and applies it to the domain of action. The theory makes use of familiar assumptions about the non-extensionality, context and interest relativity of explanation, and essentially relies on the counterfactual analysis of causal explanation (but not of causation) proposed by Steven Schiffer and others (according to which “the F causally explains the G iff (a) the F caused the G, and (b) the F would not have caused the G if the F had not be an F”; p. 200), save for some minor modifications to take care of possible objections relating to “transworld identity”, essentialism, overdetermination, and the necessity/sufficiency of the analysans. While Ruben does not assume that every action has a cause, he reasonably accepts the principle that if an action has a cause, it has a causal explanation (under appropriate descriptions of the cause and the effect). This of course establishes a connection between a (metaphysical) causal theory of action and an (epistemological) causal theory of action explanation. For example if CTA is true, then a corresponding causal theory of action explanation CTAE (every action is an event causally explained by rationalizing mental states) is also true. Ruben’s causal theory of action explanation, of course, is quite different from CTAE, not only in rejecting the view that an action explanation must invoke rationalizing mental causes, but also in remaining agnostic on the view that all action explanation is causal, and in refraining from imposing specific constraints on the nature of the cause (when the action has a cause) and its relation to either macro-level (folk) or micro-level (physical) laws. Action explanations and the counterfactuals on which they are based “are explanatory using only the resources available at the folk level itself” (p. 197), and not only do not depend on folk-psychological covering laws (there aren’t any, just as Davidson thought), but do not even imply or presuppose (as Davidson thought they did) the existence of micro-level laws under which the action-event and its cause might be subsumed under a (micro-)physical description. However, as Jaegwon Kim has often argued, a problem with this type of law-independent counterfactualist account is that no explanation is offered of why such macro-level counterfactuals should hold at all, or why, when they do hold, an adequate (e.g. non-epiphenomenalist) explanation has been provided. Granted that I would not have drunk the water had I not felt thirsty, what makes that counterfactual true? And since it is (presumably) also true that I would not have drunk the water had I not been in a neural state of a certain sort, how does an explanation of the drinking in terms of feeling thirsty avoid a commitment to epiphenomenalism, or – if feeling thirsty is equated with being in a certain neural state – to type-reductionism? Apparently Ruben is unconcerned with these questions, avowing that his position on causal explanation is consistent both with “macro-causal epiphenomenalism” and with “macro-causal reductionism” (p. 198); after all, the epistemology of explanation should not depend on the metaphysics of causation. Still, one wonders whether what we are offered is not, as Kim might put it, a “free-lunch” solution to the problem of action explanation.

None of the above, of course, challenges the quality of this book, which is by any measure a highly valuable contribution to the theory of action and action explanation. Because of its novel standpoint on many issues and its subtle and sustained critique of much current wisdom, its readers will find this book both inspiring and challenging.