Action, Contemplation, and Happiness: An Essay On Aristotle

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C. D. C. Reeve, Action, Contemplation, and Happiness: An Essay On Aristotle, Harvard University Press, 2012, 299pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674063730.

Reviewed by Christiana Olfert, Tufts University


In Action, Contemplation, and Happiness, C. D. C. Reeve presents an ambitious, three-hundred-page capsule of Aristotle's philosophy organized around the ideas of action, contemplation, and happiness. He aims to show that practical wisdom and theoretical wisdom are very similar virtues, and therefore, despite what scholars have often thought, there are few difficult questions about how virtuous action and theoretical contemplation are to be reconciled in a happy life.

One of the book's most novel features is its complex methodology. First, Reeve aims to discuss the notions of action, contemplation, and happiness from the perspective of Aristotle's thought as a whole. To do this, he covers a truly extraordinary range of topics from the corpus, and his highly integrative, multidisciplinary approach is to be applauded. Second, he plans to "think everything out afresh for myself, as if I were the first one to attempt the task." (ix) Because of this, he only rarely engages in detail with scholarly debates on major topics. Third, Reeve describes the structure of his text as a "map of the Aristotelian world," which proceeds through a "holism" of discussions that evolve as the book progresses. (ix-x) As such, readers should not expect a point-by-point argument about specific aspects of Aristotle's views about action, contemplation, and happiness that arise from his physical, metaphysical, and theological views. Nor should they always expect Reeve's first word on a subject to be the same as his last. For instance, in Chapter 2, he introduces the idea of "practical perception" as the simple experience of perceptual pleasure and pain; then in Chapter 5, he extends this idea to include a highly complex noetic activity that results from rational deliberation.

Finally, Reeve supplements his discussions with original translations of Aristotle, many of which are extensive excerpts set apart from the main text. These translations are comfortably clear and readable, which makes them accessible to readers of all levels. Specialists will notice that some translations of key terms are rather traditional (e.g., "aretê" is translated as "virtue" not "excellence," "meson" as "mean" not "intermediate," "ousia" as "substance" without comment, "eudaimonia" as "happiness" with some discussion), with a few notable exceptions ("athanatizein" in NE X.7 is literally rendered "to immortalize," and "poiêtikos nous" from DA III.5 is literally rendered "productive understanding," which unfortunately suggests the productive reasoning that is contrasted with practical and theoretical reasoning).

The first two chapters argue that we acquire our abilities to act and to contemplate in similar ways. Chapter 1, "The Transmission of Form," explains Aristotle's views about the material processes by which human beings come to be contemplators and rational agents. Since there is no bodily organ for rational understanding (nous), the material processes that generate the human body in sexual reproduction cannot generate our understanding. Instead, understanding, both practical and theoretical, enters the human organism "from the outside," which Reeve interprets to mean that it comes from the circular motions of the ether that accompany -- but are not part of -- the sperm when it fertilizes the menses.

Chapter 2, "Truth, Action, and Soul," explains the psychology of human agency and rational thought, the capacities of the soul that "control action and truth." Here, Reeve argues that our practical and contemplative activities share not only a material origin, but also a developmental starting-point: sense-perception. Because it is fallible, sense-perception is not sufficiently "controlling" of truth to be solely responsible for human agency and contemplation, but it does provide a foundation for inductive learning. In the theoretical or contemplative case, ordinary sense-perception is the foundation. In the case of action and practical thought, however, learning begins with what Reeve calls "practical perception," which is the experience of pleasure and pain in the perceptual part of the soul. Practical perception then serves two purposes: to give us an object to pursue or avoid with our appetitive desires, which also occur in the perceptual part of the soul, and to provide an inductive foundation for practical thought. (However, since practical perceptions are not themselves motivational states [41-43], Reeve could have been clearer about whether and in what sense this induction results in genuinely practical -- i.e., motivating -- understanding.)

The next three chapters argue for the importance of theoretical thought in the practical sphere. Chapter 3, "Theoretical Wisdom," argues that when we understand what scientific knowledge amounts to for Aristotle, we can see that his epistemology includes ethical, political, and productive sciences as well as natural, cosmological, and theological ones. All these sciences have the same demonstrative structure, and rely on universal, invariant principles. But in some sciences, their conclusions follow only "for the most part." To explain how this is possible, Reeve argues that all scientific truths express a universal, invariant, necessary, and really obtaining connection between universals. But in particular cases, "the indefiniteness of matter" can create exceptions to these absolutely universal and invariant truths. (82) Thus, Reeve claims, even ethical laws or rules can be absolutely universal and invariant, but still hold only for the most part, because the "matter" involved in a particular situation (rather than genuinely normative considerations, one assumes) can cause an exception without threatening the strictness of the law itself. This, in turn, makes it possible for us to conceive of an Aristotelian ethical science on the same model as natural sciences.

Chapter 4, "Virtue of Character," goes on to argue that Aristotle himself uses various sciences, including ethical and political ones, to define virtue of character as "a state concerned with deliberately choosing, in a mean in relation to us, defined by a reason, that is, the one by which the practically wise man would define it." (103, Reeve's translation) Like any scientific definition, Reeve claims, this one is stated in terms of genus and differentiae, so that "the mean in relation to us" is the genus of virtue of character. He then devotes most of the chapter to defending and explaining Aristotle's claim that virtue of character is a mean in relation to us. Compared to most scholarly discussions of these topics, Reeve focuses comparatively heavily on the idea that virtues of character are relative to one's political constitution and to one's status as a human being (man, woman, child, slave), and comparatively little on Aristotle's own explanation of the mean as relative to a particular time, place, agent, object, quantity, and so on.[1]

Chapter 5, "Practical Wisdom," explains practical wisdom in terms of the so-called "practical syllogism." On Reeve's view, practical reasons have two aspects or parts, which correspond to the two premises in a syllogism. All practical reasons aim at a target, which corresponds to the major premise of a syllogism that states a universal, invariant, scientific law, grasped through understanding (nous) -- in the most general case, a definition of human happiness. And our practical reasons also involve a definition or defining-mark telling us how to hit the target in a particular situation. This corresponds to the minor premise of a syllogism, and we grasp it through a different exercise of understanding which is a species of practical perception that Reeve calls "deliberative perception." (181-186) Together, these two premises generate an action, which corresponds to a description that is validly entailed by the two premises. From this analysis of the practical syllogism, we can see that practical wisdom directly involves various forms of theoretical knowledge, including knowledge of ethical science. But the combination of major and minor premises tells us that practical wisdom itself is not a science, and, in fact, Aristotle's conception of practical wisdom incorporates elements of both 'generalism' and 'particularism' about the normative status of universal ethical laws. According to Reeve, Aristotle's conception of practical wisdom is generalist insofar as universal, scientific ethical laws most basically justify practically wise action. But Aristotle also says that universal ethical laws cannot guide action without being applied, through a form of perception, to the specific features of a particular situation. So his view also incorporates some particularist insights, since the perception of particulars is the starting-point for learning and applying universal ethical laws, and ultimately particulars are the truth-makers for these laws.

The last three chapters of the book argue that, although for Aristotle complete happiness consists in contemplative activity, the completely happy human life includes many other valuable things, including different practical activities and virtues. Chapter 6, "Immortalizing Beings," explains what Reeve takes to be the main ethical prescription in the Nicomachean Ethics: the best thing we can do is to "immortalize" ourselves. Reeve interprets this claim literally, as a prescription to make our own intellect identical with the immortal, pure activity that is God, by contemplating him just as he contemplates "his own otherwise blank self." (210)

Chapter 7, "Happiness," explains Aristotle's claims that theoretical wisdom is the best and most complete (teleion) human virtue, and that theoretical contemplation is the best and most complete form of happiness. On Reeve's view, these are teleological claims about theoretical wisdom and contemplation as final and complete ends, with practical virtues and activities aiming to "maximize" contemplation. (237) (The precise nature of this teleological relationship is not always clear: Reeve says that noble, non-final ends are "intrinsically choiceworthy . . . only as a means to happiness," but also that achieving intermediate ends is "part of achieving" the final end. [125, 234, my emphasis])

Chapter 8, "The Happiest Life," seeks to correct the impression that the completely happy contemplative life is nothing but a life devoted to completely happy contemplative activity. In fact, there are many different aspects of the completely happy human life, as a happy human life, that are not reducible to contemplative activity itself. For instance, because a theoretically wise contemplator has a complex, incarnate nature, she may become bored with her contemplation of God. (268) So the happiest life will require the exercise of practical wisdom to provide the agent with stimulating contemplative alternatives from its own store of scientific knowledge. As such, even if the activities of practical wisdom and excellent character are not parts of the highest form of happiness, they are integral, ongoing parts of the happiest contemplative life, just as theoretical and scientific thought are integral, ongoing parts of the exercise of the practical virtues. In the happiest life, then, practical pursuits are not only compatible with theoretical ones, but the distinction between "practical" and "theoretical" nearly disappears.

This is a book of admirable breadth, detail, and complexity, but it also has some difficulties. One arises from Reeve's methodology. On the one hand, he attempts to re-think Aristotle's ethics for himself from the ground up. On the other hand, he clearly also hopes to resolve (or perhaps prevent) some famous debates in Aristotelian ethics, including the generalist-particularist debate and the inclusivism-exclusivism debate about the role of non-contemplative goods in complete happiness. The result is that, at times, Reeve seems to be pronouncing on these familiar debates without having directly addressed the central arguments and concerns of each side. So although he has important insights about these debates, some experts may find his solutions unsatisfying. For instance, as I have indicated, his comments about the teleological relationship between practical activities and contemplation may be less precise than parties to the inclusivist-exclusivist debate would want. And his description of Aristotle as an ethical generalist depends upon his own view about the role of ethical science in practical reasoning which, as we will see, is not unproblematic.

Reeve's notion of ethical science is an indispensable cornerstone in the book.[2] He uses relatively little positive textual evidence to show that there is such a thing for Aristotle, instead relying substantially on arguments that Wittgenstein-inspired particularist readings and objections against the existence of universal ethical laws are misguided.[3] On Reeve's view, Aristotle is simply "unperturbed" by questions about "how correctly to apply . . . universal principles in particular circumstances": deliberative perception, informed by one's character and upbringing, literally sees how unchanging, universal, and necessary principles apply to the changing, particular, and contingent circumstances of action.[4] (193) Moreover, Reeve suggests that by positing an ethical science, he will be able to resolve those aforementioned debates.

I am sympathetic to Reeve's strategy of refocusing these familiar debates. But there is also an older and more problematic context for the idea of ethical science. Reeve's invocation of ethical science leads to a rather Platonic interpretation of Aristotle that identifies the starting-points of practically wise reasoning as theoretical, unchanging, universal principles. The problem is that Aristotle objects to the Platonic conception of practical reasoning. One objection, stated in both the NE and the EE, is that universal and unchanging principles like the Form of the Good cannot be practical -- knowing them cannot tell us what to do.[5] In part, they cannot tell us what to do because of important metaphysical and epistemological differences, even on Aristotle's view, between such principles and the changing, particular, and concrete facts about the circumstances in which we act.[6] This objection suggests that Aristotle is indeed "perturbed" about how unchanging universals apply to changing particulars, and he must have developed his own theories of practical reasoning and practical wisdom with this problem in mind. But "deliberative perception" does not offer a solution here: it merely postulates a bridge between universals and particulars without showing how a bridge is possible.

A more charitable reading, contra Reeve, would be that Aristotle sought to avoid this Platonic problem by developing an innovative, non-Platonic distinction in kind between practical thought on the one hand and scientific and theoretical thought on the other. In light of such considerations, we might worry that by making ethical science central to practical wisdom, Reeve has failed to preserve key differences between Aristotle's and Plato's theories of ethical thinking, and consequently has made Aristotle's conception of practical wisdom especially vulnerable to some old Platonic problems. Then, by making the practical syllogism the "organizing focus" of practical deliberation, he has perhaps even exacerbated these problems for Aristotle, since on his view practical wisdom must now bridge the gap between unchanging universals and changing particulars each time it deliberates.

Another difficulty with Reeve's conception of ethical science concerns how it is learned. On Reeve's view, this begins with induction over practical perceptions -- basic experiences of pleasure and pain. I am sympathetic to several aspects of this proposal: it identifies experiences of pleasure and pain as starting-points in the cognitive development of practical wisdom, and it emphasizes deep analogies between the acquisition of practical and theoretical wisdom. However, there is a lacuna at the heart of Reeve's version of this proposal. Although he does not give us much detail about the universal and invariant "ethical laws" that supposedly make up this science, he does say that they include the definition of the human good, i.e., happiness.[7] (172) So, in order to make plausible the idea that principles about the human good are acquired through a process of induction, we need to know how information about goodness makes its way into this process. This naturally raises the question: What is the content of experiences of pleasure and pain, such that they are the starting-points for inductively inferring a conclusion about the good? The most Reeve has to say about this point is that "pleasure . . . is woven into every good and pain into every bad," but unfortunately, this remark does not illuminate the matter. (43) Yet without a clear answer to this question, Reeve has not yet given us a convincing account of what ethical science is or how it is acquired. And without this account, the book's central argument is missing a cornerstone.


Aristotle. Nicomachean Ethics, 2nd ed. Trans. Terence Irwin. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Co., 1999.

Broadie, Sarah. "Commentary" in Nicomachean Ethics, Trans. Broadie and Rowe. New York: Oxford University Press, 2002.

Gerson, Lloyd P. Aristotle and Other Platonists. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 2005.

Joachim, H. H. Aristotle, the Nicomachean Ethics: a Commentary. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1951.

Reeve, C. D. C. Practices of Reason. New York: Oxford University Press, 1995.

[1] See Nicomachean Ethics II.6.

[2] For more on Reeve's contention that there is scientific ethical knowledge, readers could consult Practices of Reason, pp. 22-30.

[3] His main textual evidence from the ethical works comes from Aristotle's mention of êthikê in NE 1094b10-11; an implication in NE V.10, 1106a29-b7; and Reeve's claim that NE I.1-2 argues for ethical science as one of the "choice-relevant sciences" (93, 79, and 228-34). But his interpretations of these passages are not decisive.

[4] For instance, he rightly warns against particularist readings of Aristotle that confuse the question of whether there are universal ethical laws with the question of whether there is an algorithm for virtuous action (83-84, 150, 160-161, 192-4).

[5] See NE 1096b31-1097a13 and EE 1217b23-25.

[6] Scholars who agree that Aristotle's criticism of Plato at NE 1096b31-1097a13 is motivated by the differences between unchanging, necessary universals and changing, contingent particulars include the following: Broadie comments that: "Even if it exists, the Platonic Form of good is not the chief good we are seeking because (being part of the eternal structure of reality) it is not doable or capable of being acquired" (Broadie 272, my emphasis). Irwin says: "elsewhere Aristotle gives a less one-sided view of the role of Universal and Particular in crafts" (Irwin 180, my emphasis). Joachim glosses Aristotle's criticism as follows: "an abstract ideal of this kind is of no use . . . the ideals which control production and action are the determinate, special, concrete goods" (Joachim 47, my emphasis). Gerson suggests that Aristotle's complaint here is either that "theoretical knowledge is irrelevant to ethical practice" or that "those immersed in theory are not thereby able to direct ethical and political practices" (Gerson 262-3). For more on Aristotle's claim that the object of practical reason and practical wisdom is something practicable as opposed to something scientific, theoretical, or which cannot be otherwise, see e.g. NE 1103b27-31, 1139a6-17, 1140a34-1140b4, and 1141b9-15.

[7] He does, however, frequently speak about universal ethical laws in the plural (e.g., 79, 82, 186, 188). In Practices of Reason he names eudaimonia as a first principle in ethical science, as well as the claim that "we all aim at eudaimonia (or what we take to be eudaimonia) in all our actions"; he also says that "other psychological principles, such as those bearing on the division of the psyche into parts and faculties or those dealing with akrasia or weakness of will, may well count as first principles"; and he claims that the other "quintessentially ethical" first principles are the fine, the just, and the right (Reeve 1995, 27-28.)