Action, Ethics, and Responsibility

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Joseph Keim Campbell, Michael O'Rourke, and Harry S. Silverstein (eds), Action, Ethics, and Responsibility, The MIT Press, 2010, 307pp., $32.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780262514842.

Reviewed by Peter A. Graham, University of Massachusetts, Amherst


The papers collected in this volume all derive from presentations given at the ninth annual Inland Northwest Philosophy Conference in 2006. In the introductory chapter the editors attempt to impose a conceptual unity on the collection by claiming that the essays in it "concern a wide variety of topics, all of which are significantly related to the issue of responsibility". That they concern a wide variety of topics, there can be no doubt. That they are all significantly related to the issue of responsibility is a bit more questionable. But that this confers some unity, even a very loose one, on the collection is quite a stretch. Essay collections compiled from conference programs can often tend toward the disjointed, but this collection is particularly so.

Even if there is a unified concept of moral responsibility (of which I'm skeptical, given the myriad ways different authors seem to use 'moral responsibility'), there really is much less connecting these papers than the editors' claim might suggest. In a number of cases, for example, the significant relation to moral responsibility is no tighter than that a certain essay discusses some issue or other in morality. Here, very briefly, is a flavor of the wide variety of different philosophical topics covered. Chapters 2 and 3 both discuss and defend the moral significance of the killing/letting die distinction. Chapter 5 argues that intentions needn't be conscious, while chapter 4 defends the view that making up one's mind about what to do is active in a way that making it up about what to believe is not. Chapter 6 explores Locke's multiple confusing takes on "freedom of the will". Chapter 7 attempts to discredit the Mind Argument for the incompatibility of indeterminism and anyone's having a choice about anything.

Chapters 8 through 11 discuss different questions about the nature and conditions of freedom and moral blameworthiness. Chapter 12 suggests some ways in which groups of agents might be viewed as agents themselves, and chapter 13 offers an argument against certain forms of metaethical noncognitivism from the possibility of a particular type of volitional incapacity. And, finally, whereas chapter 14 argues that some psychologically depraved criminals deserve harsh punishment, chapter 15 explores the ins and outs of the morality of some non-standard cases of terror bombing. Each of these topics is, to be sure, quite interesting, in and of itself, and much can be gained via an examination of and reflection upon the papers in this collection. But the suggestion that they are all significantly related to the issue of responsibility more tends to confirm the suspicion that there is no such unified phenomenon as "the issue of responsibility" rather than bind the collection together. In the rest of what follows I will make some comments on just a few of the papers included.

In 'A Reappraisal of the Doctrine of Doing and Allowing' (chapter 2), David Chan argues that Warren Quinn's treatment of the killing/letting die distinction depends on intuitive verdicts about cases in which extraneous factors -- such as thoughts about risk and about prior commitments -- play a distorting role. Chan's aim, however, is not to discredit the distinction or its moral significance, but, rather, to give it a new virtue-theoretic foundation. He proposes that killing is morally worse than letting die because, and in virtue of the fact that, a failure to be disposed not to kill is a more vicious character trait than is a failure to be disposed to save others from dying.

Though I don't share Quinn's intuitions in some of his cases, I think it is implausible that Quinn's and others' verdicts about such cases are driven by the distorting factors Chan claims they are. (In motivating his own views, Chan doesn't eschew the method of appealing to intuitive verdicts about hypothetical cases. Rather, in offering them, he just explicitly stipulates away the very distorting factors he claims drive others' intuitions in their cases. Perhaps he just thinks he's better than those others at that kind of stipulating-away, for surely they intend their cases to stipulate away such distorting factors as well.) What's more, Chan's virtue-theoretic grounding of the moral significance of the distinction between killing and letting die is dubious. First, as is often complained about virtue-theoretic proposals, Chan's theory seems to get the order of explanation backwards. Intuitively, the reason why it is more vicious to lack a disposition not to kill than it is to lack a disposition to save others is that it is more wrong to kill than it is to let someone die, and not the other way around. Second, the virtue theoretic considerations to which Chan appeals to ground the moral significance of the killing/letting die distinction seem too crude to make the kinds of moral discriminations such a distinction will need to make. For instance, any remotely-plausible version of the killing/letting die distinction must have it that though it would be permissible to redirect an out-of-control trolley away from five people and onto, thereby killing, some other innocent person, it would not be permissible to stop the trolley and save the five by pushing, and thereby killing, another innocent person into it. It's hard to see how the greater viciousness of a lack of a disposition not to kill as opposed to a lack of a disposition to save is going to be able to accommodate and account for these kinds of moral contours.

Helen Frowe's "Killing John to Save Mary: A Defense of the Moral Distinction between Killing and Letting Die" (chapter 3) also seeks to shore up the killing/letting die distinction, both by undermining attacks against it offered by Michael Tooley and by offering up additional considerations in its favor. Frowe's critiques of Tooley's arguments are decisive and utterly convincing. The additional intuitive considerations concerning self-defensive action she appeals to in favor of the distinction are also quite persuasive: though it is often morally permissible for X to take harmful, even lethal, self-defensive action against Y in order to prevent Y from killing X, it is very rarely (if ever) morally permissible for X to take similar harmful or lethal action against Y in order to prevent Y from letting X die. The very plausible explanation of this asymmetry, to which Frowe's discussion points, is that lethal self-defensive action is only warranted when the wrong to be prevented is sufficiently great and being killed is a greater wrong than is merely being allowed to die.

I have no criticism of Frowe's arguments to offer. Rather, I'd merely add that just as there is a moral difference between X's killing Y in order to prevent Y from killing X and X's killing Y in order to prevent Y from letting X die, so too is there a moral difference between X's killing Z in order to prevent Y from killing X and X's letting Z die in order to prevent Y from killing X. Whereas it is permissible to let an innocent third-party drown if a villain will kill you if you rescue her, it is not permissible to actively drown an innocent third-party even if a villain will kill you if you don't. Because letting die is less seriously wrong than killing, in many instances one may let other innocents die, but may not kill them, in order to save oneself.

In 'The Fall of the Mind Argument and Some Lessons about Freedom' (chapter 7), E. J. Coffman and Donald Smith mount an attack on the Mind Argument for the incompatibility of causal indeterminism and anyone's being able to do otherwise than she in fact does. First, they argue that the soundness of the argument depends for its cogency on the truth of a principle they dub γ. Second, they maintain that the Mind Argument fails irrespective of whether γ is true. But, third, "depending on γ's truth-value, the Mind argument fails in such a way that one or the other of the two main species of libertarianism [reductive and non-reductive] is the best approach to the metaphysics of freedom." Finally, as they hold that γ is true, it follows, they claim, that non-reductive libertarianism is the best approach to the metaphysics of freedom.

I'm no friend of the Mind Argument, but Coffman and Smith's attack on it fails. They are wrong in three of their contentions: (1) that γ is true, (2) that the Mind Argument presupposes γ in the way they suggest, and (3) that γ shows that reductive libertarianism is false.

Here is the principle, γ:

(γ) Suppose an event, e, has only events in its causal history. Then an agent, S, has a choice about e only if there is an event in e's causal history about which S has a choice.

Coffman and Smith maintain that the Mind Argument presupposes γ because it is the only principle they can think of that justifies the premise that the hypothetical agent who is the focus of the Mind Argument has no choice about the desires and beliefs he has at the moment of, and which cause, the very first action he ever (putatively) has a choice about performing. They also argue that γ entails the falsity of reductivism -- the view that there are some events that some agents do have a choice about even though only events ever figure in the causal history of an event. Here, in snapshot-form, is the argument: if γ and reductivism are both true, then any agent who has a choice about an event is an agent who has a choice about each distinct event in some infinite chain of events stretching backwards in the past. But as that is absurd, if γ is true, then reductivism is false. Were γ true, then non-reductivists, i.e., proponents of agent causation, would be sitting pretty. It's a good thing, then, that there's no reason to accept γ.

Coffman and Smith motivate γ via consideration of examples like the following: a rock shatters a window and Jill, by stipulation, lacks a choice about any of the events in the shattering's causal history. Merely from this description of the case, they assert, it seems to follow straightaway that Jill lacked a choice about the shattering of the window. That seems right. But such an observation falls well shy of establishing γ. Though there are many types of events for which γ seems true, there is a class of events for which it has no plausibility whatsoever.

In action theory a distinction is often drawn between basic and non-basic actions: basic actions are not, whereas non-basic actions are, actions we perform by performing yet other actions. The by-relation in virtue of which this distinction is drawn is, of course, notoriously slippery and difficult to analyze, but that it holds between different actions is uncontroversial. I turn on the light by flipping the switch. I flip the switch by moving my finger in a certain way. And so on, until we reach some action in virtue of which I perform all the rest but which is not itself such that I perform it by performing any other action; rather, I do it directly. All chains of action must terminate in some basic action. Now, not only is it agreed that there are some basic actions, it is also often agreed that basic actions are mental actions of some sort or other, and one popular candidate for such basic mental actions is choices.

I can see no reason for thinking that γ holds for choices. Suppose that Christian chooses to press a certain button, does so, and thus detonates a bomb. Let's suppose that none of the events leading up to Christian's choice to press the button -- the mental events constituting his deliberation about whether to press it -- are ones that he has any choice about. Does it follow, intuitively, from this fact that after having considered all the pros and cons of pressing the button and reached the point of making a choice he then had no choice about his choosing to press the button? Hardly. Choices are the very kinds of things our having a choice about doesn't require having a choice about yet other things. The reason why (in Coffman and Smith's case ) it intuitively follows from Jill's not having a choice about anything in the window shattering's causal history that she doesn't have a choice about the window's shattering is that window-shatterings are not the kinds of events anyone has any direct choice about. The only things we have direct control over, after all, are the basic actions we perform, and window-shatterings aren't even actions, let alone basic actions. And so, as it is stipulated in the case that there are no other events in the causal history of the shattering she has a choice about in virtue of which she might have a choice about the shattering, it follows that Jill has no choice about the shattering.

Not only is there no reason to accept γ, there is also no reason to think that the Mind Argument presupposes γ in the way that Coffman and Smith suggest. The premise that an agent has no choice about the desires and beliefs she has prior to the very first action she ever (putatively) has a choice about performing can be motivated independently of γ. If all we ever directly have a choice about are our actions, then if some event or state of affairs is not an action, then our having a choice about it requires there being some other event -- in particular, an event involving some choice of ours – that we have a choice about in virtue of which we have a choice about it. But, if that's right, then, if, as stipulated in the case, the desires and beliefs of the agent in question occur prior to anything she has a choice about, and given that the occurrences of those desires and beliefs are themselves not choices, it follows straightaway, and independently of γ, that the agent in question does not have a choice about her having those desires and beliefs.

And finally, though Coffman and Smith are right that if γ is true then reductivism is false, since there is no reason to accept γ, there is no threat to reductivism. All reductivists need to accept is the eminently plausible thesis that choices (or whatever actions one takes to be basic) are events that agents can have a choice about, when they do, not by having a choice about any other event.

In "Selective Hard Compatibilism" (chapter 8), Paul Russell proposes to refine Hard Compatibilism -- the thesis that agents can be blameworthy for what they do even when their doing so is the direct result of the covert manipulation and control of another agent -- by adding to it the claim that it is inappropriate for manipulators to blame those they manipulate. From what he writes, it's not clear whether Russell thinks that this claim serves merely to dispense with the/a main source of intuitive resistance to Hard Compatibilism, or whether it is also supposed to mark a substantive restriction on the content of Hard Compatibilism. Much of his discussion, in particular his talk of one person's being "responsible to" another person, suggests that he thinks the latter.

Insofar as Hard Compatibilism is a theory about blameworthiness (and I take Russell's talk of moral responsibility here merely to be elliptical for talk of blameworthiness), and a blamer-relative notion of blameworthiness, i.e., a notion licensing locutions like 'X is blameworthy to Y, but not to Z, for phi-ing', is incoherent, which I take it that it is, Russell's view, construed as a content-restricted version of Hard Compatibilism, makes no sense. Furthermore, Hard Compatibilism no more needs restricting to account for the fact that it is inappropriate for manipulators to blame those they manipulate than it does to account for the fact that it would be inappropriate for a notorious car thief to blame someone else for stealing her own car. Even on a neo-Strawsonian conception of blameworthiness (one to which Russell indicates he is sympathetic) according to which one's being blameworthy for something is a matter of its being appropriate that certain blame emotions be felt toward one on account of one's doing it, there is most certainly room for distinguishing between a blame emotion's being an appropriate response to someone for doing something, and the appropriateness of particular individuals' responding to her in that way in response to her doing it.

If, on the other hand, Russell's claim is meant not as a restriction on the content of Hard Compatibilism but, rather, merely as a response to what is taken to lie behind intuitive resistance to it, it is a response to a phantom concern. The intuitive resistance to Hard Compatibilism has far more to do with the perceived lamentable condition of the manipulated agent (the psychological incompatibility of simultaneously feeling both pity and the blame emotions toward someone, I'd suggest, is, at least in part, at the root of intuitive resistance to Hard Compatibilism) than it does with reflection upon the inappropriateness of manipulators blaming those they manipulate. (In fact, I'd bet that for the vast majority of those who have felt intuitive resistance to Hard Compatibilism, the bizarre possibility of a covert manipulator's blaming a person for doing what she has manipulated her to do has never even crossed their minds.)

The essays in this collection discuss a host of very interesting topics, and though it's dubious that they are all significantly related to the issue of moral responsibility, they all most certainly demand sustained philosophical treatment, treatment which the essays in this collection go no small way toward providing.