Action in Perception

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Alva Noë, Action in Perception, MIT Press, 2005, 392pp, $38.00 (cloth), ISBN 0262140888.

Reviewed by by Michael Pace, Chapman University


This book is a sustained explanation and defense of the "enactive account" of perception, an approach to explaining perceptual consciousness that Alva Noë has defended in a series of recent papers and in collaboration with others (notably Evan Thompson, Susan Hurley and Kevin O'Regan). The enactive account that Noë defends can look like a radical departure from traditional theories of sense perception that treat perception as a mental state that serves as an input to action and thought but is not itself a kind of action or thought. In several attention-grabbing slogans that appear throughout the book Noë registers his opposition to this psychological division of labor: "Perceiving is something we do," he says, and in Chapter 7 he suggests that it is also "a thoughtful activity". Perception, Noë tells us, is both a kind of action and a way of thinking about the world.

According to the main claim of the enactive account, perceptual awareness depends constitutively on the perceiver's having "sensorimotor knowledge", an implicit understanding of the way sensory stimulation varies with movement. It is this claim that is meant to support the idea that perception is both a kind of action and thought. To get a feel for what Noë has in mind when he talks about sensorimotor knowledge, consider a perceptual event in which you see a ripe tomato. According to the enactive approach, seeing a ripe tomato consists in part in your having a bit of practical knowledge: you must know how the visual stimulation you have would vary if you or the tomato were to move in certain predictable ways. When you successfully see the tomato, you understand implicitly what would happen experientially if you were to move your eyes, or body, or shift your attention, and you also understand what would happen experientially if the tomato were to be moved.

One consequence of requiring sensorimotor knowledge for successful perception is that disruptions to the normal way that movement affects sensory stimulation can result in failing to perceive. For example, Noë claims that experimental subjects who are made to wear goggles that invert the light entering the eye (so that, e.g., light that normally enters the left side of the eye now enters the right and vice versa) are initially "experientially blind". Because they can no longer understand how movement affects their sensory stimulations they can no longer see. Subjects of these experiments who are made to wear inverted goggles for long periods of time are eventually able to adapt to wearing the goggles and can eventually move and act with relative ease. Noë treats this as a complete restoration of sight, and he claims as a virtue of the enactive account that it has resources for making sense of our ability to perceptually adapt to the lenses.

What are the sensory stimulations that Noë thinks one must understand in order to perceive? Although the phrase "sensory stimulations" figures in canonical statements of the enactive account, Noë often speaks interchangeably of "appearances" (and even sometimes of "sensations"). Appearances play a central role in Noë's accounts of perceptual constancy and perceptual content, and he shares with classical sense-data theorists and Early Moderns a sense of the importance of accounting for their perspectival nature. For example, Noë accepts that there is a true sense in which coins appear elliptical when viewed at a slant and tables look smaller as you move away from them. Likewise, Noë holds that there can be great variations in consciously accessible color looks even when one knows that a single stable color property is in view. Looking at the corner of a room painted white, for example, yields a variety of color looks even though the wall in another sense may look to be uniformly white.

Chapters 3 and 4, which Noë regards as the heart of the book, develop theories of the spatial and color content of visual experience that are meant to do justice to the perspectival character of appearances. In both chapters a key idea is that perception has a dual content, presenting subjects with both constant properties of things and apparent properties (perspectival properties, as Noë sometimes calls them). The apparent properties of which one is aware account for the perspectival nature of appearances, and they have a primacy of place. According to Noë, constant properties of objects are represented implicitly by the subject's practical grasp of the way apparent properties would vary with possible movements. For example, your perceptual appreciation of the actual shape of the tomato consists in an understanding of the way its apparent shape would change if you or it moved. Likewise, one's grasp of the whiteness of a wall that one perceives consists in one's appreciation of the way the appearance varies or would vary under different lighting conditions or when viewed from different perspectives.

Although Noë might seem to give a nod to sense-data theorists insofar as he acknowledges the need to account for the perspectival character of perceptual phenomenology, he denies that there is any need to posit mental objects as the bearers of apparent properties. (He also dismisses the argument from hallucination for sense data, that postulating mental objects with the same properties offers the best explanation of the possibility of indistinguishable perceptions and hallucinations. In a disappointingly brief discussion of the argument, he accepts J.L. Austin's claim that just because the subject can't tell a difference in the phenomenology of two experiences doesn't show that there is not a difference.) Nor does Noë think that apparent properties are qualia, intrinsic properties of experience, or properties of mental visual fields, or any such. He insists, rather, that apparent properties are objective in the sense that they don't depend for their nature on what perceivers do or what goes on in them. Apparent shape and size, for example, are taken to be relations between objects and vantage points. Perceivers with appropriate sensorimotor understanding perceive these properties when they occupy these vantage points (under appropriate lighting conditions).

The account of perceptual constancy that I've so far attributed to Noë might seem to suggest the following story about perceptual content:

Visual experience at any moment involves occurrent representations of perspectival properties, which are relational properties of one's environment. These properties are at least part of what is given in experience at any point in time. Constant properties of objects are not strictly speaking given in experience but are represented implicitly by the subject's current expectations of how the occurrently represented perspectival properties would vary with possible movements.

This story would not be wholly unfamiliar to intentionalist theorists of perception such as Gilbert Harman, Michael Tye, Sydney Shoemaker and others, who accept the need to acknowledge that perspectival features are represented in experience while denying the need to posit qualia to explain them. However, the story does not seem to be Noë's. It leaves out a key aspect of his thought, namely that the content of experience is (to quote another slogan that appears throughout the book) "virtual all the way in". Noë means by this that we can't distinguish between an occurrent or given part of perceptual content and a merely potential part. "Qualities," he says "are available in experience as possibilities, as potentialities, but not as givens." (135)

This is a hard doctrine to accept (and to understand), and I found Noë's explanation and defense of the view to be one of the least satisfying parts in the book. One might think that there are clear cases in which a quality is wholly given as part of the content of experience -- for example, the perspectival shape of the tomato that one sees when one looks at the tomato or the look of red one experiences when one is presented with a uniformly colored red patch. Noë thinks that careful reflection on visual phenomenology suggests that these are not examples of qualities given in experience, and he thinks that this claim is further supported by empirical research on change blindness. (In typical change blindness experiments, subjects are shown, in succession, a picture of a scene followed by a short interval of a blank screen and then by a similar scene with some aspect of the original scene changed. Subjects typically fail to notice changes in the scene that in retrospect seem as if they would be impossible to miss.) Considering the example of seeing the surface of a tomato, Noë says,

Take a tomato out. Look at it. Yes, you have a sense that the facing side of the tomato is all there, all at once. But if you are careful you will admit that you don't actually experience every part even of its visible surface all at once. Your eyes scan the surface, and you direct your attention to this or that. Further evidence is provided by change blindness. As discussed in chapters 2 and 4, the very color of the object you are staring at can change right before your eyes without your noticing it, so long as you are not attending to the color itself!

What this shows … is that you cannot factor experience into an occurrent and a merely potential part. Pick any candidate for the occurrent factor. Now consider it. It too is structured; it too has hidden facets or aspects. It is present only in potential. (217)

Disputes about how correctly to describe the phenomenology of experience can be frustratingly difficult to decide. For my part, when I try Noë's phenomenological experiment, I find it difficult to agree with him completely. Looking at a cherry tomato held suitably far away so that it is in the fovea (center) of the visual field, the surface seems all there, fully present at a glance. And even when I use a larger tomato, I get a sense that I am fully presented with the shape of the whole surface of the tomato at some level of detail, although I agree with Noë that I also have a sense that by changing my gaze I can get a more determinate presentation of some part of the shape. As Noë notes at several points in the book, it has long been known that visual acuity drops off rapidly from the center of the visual field to the periphery (and, as he also correctly notes, this drop-off can be introspected). These facts, though, can be accounted for by allowing that the spatial features occurrently represented during a single glance are more or less determinate, depending on where they are in the visual field. The foveated parts of the overall shapes of things before us are represented in a relatively fine-grained way, and shapes of things in the periphery are represented in less detail. I can't see how Noë's observations support the claim that there is no distinction between properties that are given in experience and those that are merely potentially given. As for the evidence of change blindness, it seems to me that such experiments at best show that there is less to the occurrent content of experience than we might have thought, not that there are no qualities that are given in experience.

Noë mentions an additional consideration in support of his denial that visually attending to a uniformly colored patch would involve a simple quality occurrently presented in experience. He claims that experiencing a color look is constituted by a complex ability to grasp the color's necessary relations of similarity and difference to other colors. (138) For example, experiencing a red look is constituted by an implicit understanding of facts such as that it is closer to the look of orange than to the look of green, that lightening it would produce pink, etc. I suspect that this will seem to many readers (as it does to me) to get the order of explanation the wrong way around. It is because experiencing a red look is a presentation of a distinctive intrinsic quality that we are able to recognize its position in phenomenal color space.

The doctrine that "perceptual content is virtual all the way in" is part of Noë's adherence to a strong externalist thesis about perceptual content according to which part of the contents of experience consists of features of the world that are not represented or modeled internally. In slogan form, "Experiences are not in the head." I suspect, though, that this doctrine has implausible consequences for certain kinds of illusions. Consider Noë's treatment of illusions involving Ames' rooms, non-rectangular rooms that when looked at from a certain perspective look like rectangular rooms. (For an example, see At one point, Noë says that Ames' room illusions aren't really illusions, since "In a full-blooded sense … the illusory rectangular room doesn't look rectangular at all." (81) Noë's reason for thinking that the room does not look rectangular is that further movement would yield experiences that reveal the non-rectangular shape of the room. On the assumption that the content of experience can include properties in the world that are not internally represented, it is not surprising that Noë would treat these cases as non-illusory. It is, however, unintuitive, and a few pages later he seems to recognize this. There, he accepts the much more plausible view that Ames' room illusions are genuine cases of illusion and gives what seems to be a promising explanation as to why they are genuinely perceptual illusions and not mere errors in judgment: "One doesn't misperceive because one judges wrongly, but because one draws on the wrong sensorimotor skills and expectations." (86) This passage makes it clear that what matters to the content of the experience are one's expectations of the way appearances would change if one were to move that matter, not the way the appearances would actually change. But I cannot see how to make sense of an expectation without postulating an occurrent representation as to how things appear now and a representation of the way movements would change the appearances, both of which seem to be internal matters. I suspect that to the extent that Noë plausibly relies on expectations to determine the content of experience, the content of experience will consist in what is internally represented.

Despite these reservations about Noë's approach, I highly recommend this book. It is clearly written, accessible, and often very insightful. And it is interesting, chocked-full of interesting interpretations of current empirical work on perception. It should be required reading for anyone interested in contemporary psychological and philosophical work on perception.