Action, Knowledge, and Will

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John Hyman, Action, Knowledge, and Will, Oxford University Press, 2015, 255pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198735779.

Reviewed by Andrei A. Buckareff, Marist College


Readers familiar with John Hyman’s work in the philosophy of action know that his is one of a growing number of voices critical of what is often identified as the orthodox conception of action and agency. So it will come as no surprise that he targets many of the background commitments of the orthodox theory of action in this book.

The standard story of action is most often associated with the work of Donald Davidson and the myriad iterations of the causal theory of action he inspired.1 The most prominent versions of causalism all share the same core commitments. Exercises of agency are identified with actions. All actions are either intentional under a description or on the same action-tree as an intentional action. Actions are events that are caused in the right way by some appropriate rationalizing mental item(s), typically a present-directed intention that is itself the causal product of an agent’s motivational reasons. Finally, motivational reasons are mental states of an agent, typically consisting of a belief-desire pair. While some versions of causalism reject some of the foregoing commitments, they are all widely taken for granted. Hyman’s direct challenges to this orthodoxy are actually rather sparse in this book. But what he presents is an alternative that shares features with the standard story but departs from it in ways sufficient to make his approach best regarded as an alternative and not a mere revision.2

Hyman’s central assertion that guides the trajectory of his book is that human action and agency can be considered in physical, psychological, intellectual, and ethical terms (ix, 3-4). Central to understanding the physical dimension are the concepts of agent, power, and causation. For the psychological dimension, we must grasp the concepts of desire, aim, and intention. The ethical is focused on voluntariness and choice. And the intellectual is directed toward clarifying the concepts of reason, knowledge, and belief. He contends that any philosophical understanding of human agency requires considering these different dimensions of agency separately and we must understand how they are related to one another (ix). Philosophical work on human action and agency has tended to blur these distinctions.

Of the four dimensions of human agency Hyman identifies, the intellectual and the ethical receive the lion’s share of attention. Work on the ethical requires distinguishing between what makes an action intentional versus what makes an action voluntary, since being intentional is not sufficient for an action to be voluntary, according to Hyman. Understanding the intellectual dimension requires rethinking the relationship between knowledge and reasons for action, according to Hyman, and work on this problem opens up new ways for us to think about the concept of knowledge.

In what follows, I will focus most of my attention on Hyman’s treatment of voluntariness, followed by a discussion of the contributions he makes to thinking about the role of desires in the etiology and explanation of action. Unfortunately, I will only offer a brief summary and a few comments on what he says about knowledge and reasons for action.

Hyman argues that the source of some of the confusion in the philosophy of action over voluntary action stems from philosophers identifying voluntary action with intentional action and “action as such” (3). He targets what he refers to as the “modern theory of the will” as the source of much of the confusion. Judging from the philosophers on whose work he focuses, he is not merely critiquing those who endorse irreducible acts of volition as indispensable in an adequate theory of action. Rather, he targets all accounts of action that make causation by an executive mental state or causation by an act of will a necessary condition for an exercise of agency. He offers a critical but sympathetic evaluation of both Wittgenstein’s and Ryle’s critiques of the will. But, unfortunately, no particular current account of what Hyman would count as a theory of the will comes under close scrutiny, and the possible advantages of some approaches over others are glossed over.

In clarifying the concept of voluntary action, Hyman offers his readers an interesting genealogy of the idea that all action originates in the will that he takes to be at the root of the confusion about voluntariness. He argues that this idea stems from a “double misconception.” Specifically, its roots lie in both a conception of matter as inert rather than a dynamic source of motion in its own right and “a not yet fully naturalized conception of human beings” (43; cf. 29). Setting these dogmas aside results in a more gradualist metaphysics of agency on which action is the manifestation of causal powers of agents who bring about changes in the world.3 The sort of agency we often associate with human action is thus not limited to animals with the capacity to have intentions or perform acts of will. Rather any agents with “functionally differentiated parts” can manifest agency. Hyman thus seems to be working with a conception of agents as integrated operating systems whose relevant parts consist of causal powers. I am sympathetic to this general approach. But while there is much about the picture he develops that makes it a welcome corrective to some dogmas in the philosophy of action, I cannot help but wonder if Hyman’s dismissal of any vital role for intentions is too quick. Some of his reasons for rejecting a central role for intentions stem from apparently intentional behavior in animals such as spiders and the many “uncontrolled” actions humans perform “such as murmuring in one’s sleep” (50-51). In the case of non-human animals, it seems we only need to identify what is playing the functional role of an intention in the animal qua system. The non-human animal does not need to represent the relevant state as an intention in its own mind. And in the case of “actions” like murmuring in one’s sleep, it seems questionable that any such behaviors can be truthfully described as actional.

Hyman’s discussion of voluntariness comes to a close with an exploration of the normative significance of voluntariness. Hyman emphasizes that, unlike the other action-concepts he discusses in the book, voluntariness is fundamentally an ethical concept (76). A rough schema is offered for ‘voluntariness’: “Roughly, a certain thing is done voluntarily if, and only if, it is not done out of ignorance or compulsion” (77). The schema does not imply that if something is done knowingly and freely, then it is done voluntarily. For instance, Hyman notes that someone who believes he is driving against traffic on a one-way street but does not know this owing to the source of his information being untrustworthy is not excused because he didn’t do it voluntarily. Hence, “Knowledge and ignorance are contraries, not contradictories, and voluntariness is defined in terms of ignorance, not knowledge” (77). And with respect to freedom, Hyman is careful to distinguish necessity from compulsion. If freedom is understood in terms of voluntariness, Hyman asserts that “freely” would have to mean “without compulsion” (77).

Hyman’s discussion of voluntariness in this book is one of his most significant contributions. Not only does he nicely clarify the concept of voluntariness and show how it differs from some related concepts, he offers an account of the origins of the confusion over voluntariness. There is a lot here to think about. The issues raised should be of interest not only to action theorists, but also to those working on legal and moral responsibility.

In discussing the widespread confusion about voluntariness, Hyman takes a brief detour and expresses his commitment to a metaphysics of causation in thinking about agency that incorporates both events and agents as causes. Both event-causation and agent-causation should have some purchase in our thinking about action. He contends that they are interdependent, “events can only acquire the status of causes by participating in action by agents, and agents can only exercise causal powers by dint of events” (41). Central to this understanding of causation in agency is a robust conception of dispositions grounded in causal powers of agents. This picture is developed when he moves to consider the explanation of action.

Hyman attributes the impasse between causalists and non-causalists about the explanation of intentional action to “a failure of percipience about dispositions and a commitment to Humean orthodoxies about causation on both sides” (106). Desires qua dispositions are directed at various outcomes in response to different manifestation triggers. They are manifested in the causal production of action. An intentional action, which he identifies with an action done with an intention, where the intention is reduced to the content of the desire because of which an agent acts, is just the manifestation of a desire (142). By emphasizing the role of dispositions directed at manifestations, we get the irreducible teleology emphasized by many proponents of non-causalism. Thus, “an explanation of an intentional act that refers to the desire the act expressed or to the intention with which it was done is both causal and teleological” (130).

Hyman, like Rowland Stout (2006), attributes the problem of causal deviance to the Humean theory of causation. The causal power constitutive of an agent’s desire interacting with other causal powers in a causal process provides a framework to dissolve worries about basic causal deviance. An agent, according to Hyman, must do something in order to bring about a desired outcome. The Humean orthodoxy “cannot distinguish between the case where the climber loosens his hold in order to kill the other man, and the case where his desire to kill the other man causes him to loosen his hold without him doing so for this reason” (122). A causal power’s being manifested in a causal process in response to a trigger with which it interacts is normal if and only if the action is a genuine manifestation of the power. “But this process cannot be reduced to a specific kind of sequence or concatenation of events” (122).

So long as reductive programs like the Humean strategy are maintained by causalists, a solution to the problem of basic causal deviance will be elusive. Hyman recommends a promising way forward in the dialectic by urging us to accept a neo-Aristotelian metaphysics of causation that takes the powers of agents to be central in explaining actions. While this sort of approach strikes me as promising, Hyman leaves many of the details of exactly how such a proposal would work unspecified. In any case, I welcome any contributions, such as Hyman’s, to the philosophy of action that examine the implications of an ontology of causal powers and the metaphysics of causation to which it lends itself for thinking about agency.

No mention has yet been made of reasons-explanations and the role of desires in them. Hyman accepts a role for desires in reasons-explanations. Suppose I am visiting an unpleasant neighbor at his house and start to move toward the door because I want to leave and believe that by so doing I will be able to expedite the termination of the visit. My action manifests the desire and the facts that I want to leave and that I believe that heading toward the door will expedite terminating the visit would be among the reasons why I am moving toward the door, according to Hyman. What I believe, namely, “That heading toward the door will expedite terminating the visit”, provides the grounds or reason for which I act as I do (139). The reason why is the explanans and the reason for provides the justification for what I do. Importantly, a reason why an agent acts, if it is to be a genuine explanans, must be factive. He writes that, “‘explains why’ is factive because nothing can explain why something is the case if it is not the case” (148). Believing that p can be a ground. But a ground on which an agent does something is not normally that they believe that p but that p itself. This approach strikes me as a vast improvement over the anti-psychologistic accounts of reasons-explanations that have proliferated in recent years. It both allows us to emphasize reasons why as facts that favor actions while allowing us to include an agent’s psychological states in genuine reasons-explanations.

Perhaps one of the most controversial claims Hyman defends is also one of the most interesting ones. By Hyman’s own admission, it lays the foundation for what follows in the remainder of the book. Hyman claims that explanations of the form

 [1] James went to church because it would please his mother

“attribute knowledge of the explanans and not merely belief” (149). This position is sensible in light of Hyman’s claim that it is normally that p itself that is the ground on which an agent acts. Being in possession of knowledge that p is to be in possession of an ability, specifically, the ability to be guided by the fact that p. This claim about knowledge is central not only for understanding explanations by motivating reasons like [1], but he takes this claim to provide us with a proper analysis of knowledge, one that is more informative than some other “knowledge-first” proposals. Hyman spends the remainder of the book defending his analysis of knowledge and using the account to offer a reply to the Meno problem, defending why knowledge is a better guide than mere true belief for action.

Unfortunately, I cannot discuss Hyman’s proposal about knowledge and its place in action further. While his proposal is attractive, I am not entirely convinced it is correct for reasons raised by different authors (e.g., Locke 2015). Still, this section of the book should be of considerable interest to anyone interested in the role of knowledge in action.

While he challenges many widely endorsed views in contemporary philosophy of action, Hyman does not adopt an unprincipled contrarian stance. Rather, he strikes me as a friendly critic, offering ways to correct mistakes philosophers have made in the past three hundred years. The end result, as mentioned earlier, is an attractive alternative. I think that some of his proposals can be absorbed in revisions of the causalist orthodoxy. But whether this book motivates readers to abandon the orthodoxy or simply make changes to it, it is a work that anyone working in the philosophy of action will benefit from reading.


Aguilar, J. and Buckareff, A. (2010) Causing Human Actions: New Perspectives on the Causal Theory of Action. The MIT Press.

Aguilar, J. and Buckareff, A. (2015) A gradualist metaphysics of agency. In A. Buckareff, C. Moya, and S. Rosell (eds.) Agency, Freedom, and Responsibility. Palgrave.

D’Oro, G. and Sandis, C. (2013) Reasons and Causes: Causalism and Anti-Causalism in the Philosophy of Action. Palgrave.

Locke, D. (2015) Knowledge, explanation, and motivating reasons. American Philosophical Quarterly, 52, 215-232.

Stout, R. (2002) The right structure for a causal theory of action. Facta Philosophica, 4, 11-24.

Stout, R. (2006) Action.

1 See Aguilar and Buckareff 2010 and D’Oro and Sandis 2013.

2 For a promising revision of the causalist orthodoxy see Stout 2002 and 2006.

3 Hyman does not use the language of “gradualism.” This term is favored by Aguilar and Buckareff (2015) to describe a metaphysics of agency that bears a family resemblance to Hyman’s while being different from his in important respects.