Action Reconceptualized: Human Agency and Its Source

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David K. Chan, Action Reconceptualized: Human Agency and Its Sources, Lexington Books, 2016, 213pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781498519649.

Reviewed by Amir Saemi, Institute for Research in Fundamental Sciences (Tehran)


David K. Chan provides an account of various mental entities that interact with each other to produce human action. Once we have a theory of human action, Chan states, we will be in a better position to examine how to evaluate human actions from a moral perspective. Chan dedicates the first four chapters to a theory of intention, desire and trying. In the next two chapters, he applies his accounts of intention, desire and trying to tackle different problems in philosophy of action and moral philosophy.

Chan is influenced by Michael Bratman, and the book feels like a continual dialogue with Bratman. However, this comes, at times, at the expense of overlooking other views. Most of the literature Chan discusses was written in the 90s; he seldom engages with the current literature.  For example, he criticizes G.E.M. Anscombe because "her concept of intention is too broad and she failed to distinguish desire from intention" (p.173). However, this criticism is not informed by the recent literature on how to understand Anscombe (e.g., Richard Moran and Martin Stone, 2009; Michael Thompson, 2008). In particular, Moran argues that the three concepts of intention that Anscombe distinguishes share the same underlying structure, a structure that makes intention very different from static states like belief, desire and emotion.

Despite these drawbacks, Chan's discussions and arguments are often insightful and engaging. However, there are a number of claims that I find contentious. Due to lack of space, I will address only two sets of claims that I don't find convincing. The first concerns Chan's idea that we need to introduce a new category of non-intentional action (besides intentional and unintentional) to account for actions that do not result from practical reasoning. The second concerns Chan's claim that the traditional Doctrine of Double Effect is not tenable, and needs to be replaced by another doctrine he introduces.

I. Practical Reasoning and Non-Intentional Action

Chan holds the following two theses:

(a) S intentionally Xs only if S intended to X (p.19).
(b) All intentions are formed through practical reasoning (p.39).

However, many intuitively intentional actions such as akratic, habitual or arational actions are not the result of practical reasoning and thus not intentional on Chan's view. To account for those actions, Chan introduces the new category of non-intentional action which, he believes, is an important contribution. But if the conjunction of (a) and (b) is false, Chan's main reason for introducing this new category would be undermined. I think akratic, habitual and arational actions are intentional and thus counterexamples to the conjunction of (a) and (b). But I will discuss only akratic agency here. If akratic agency is intentional, we should reject either (a) or (b), especially given that Chan's argument for (b) is not convincing (let me also point out that Chan's defense of the view that habitual and arational actions are not intentional relies on (b)).

Discussing the case of Mary who stays at her sister's after dropping off a package in order to spend time with her parents, Chan says "if she stayed behind after reasoning that it is better to leave, her action would be akratic, but not intentional as it is not intended" (p.77). On the face of it, it is implausible that akratic actions are not intentional. Akratic actions are actions performed for a reason. The akratic agent thinks that her reason for action is not strong enough to override her other reasons not to perform the action. But this does not mean that she has no reason for her action. If the akratic agent is doing X for a reason and she knows non-observationally that she is doing X for that reason, it seems plausible that she is doing X intentionally. Why then does Chan hold this counter-intuitive view about akratic agency? Chan's reasons:

If she [i.e. the akratic agent] forms an intention to X simply because she desires to X, what does forming an intention add to the desire that she already has? . . . the intention seems redundant if all it does is motivate the agent to act because of the desire, since the desire can already do that. (p.76)

According to Chan, we can explain the action of an akratic agent like Mary by her desire alone, so we don't need to attribute her an intention to, say, stay at her sister's to explain her action. However, I think there are good reasons to hold that the akratic agent has the intention to perform the akratic action. Let me state two.

First, as R. Jay Wallace (2011) observes, "people sometimes exhibit great intelligence and skill in executing plans that they view as dubious or questionable". Akratic actions take time, and require planning and instrumental reasoning. Consider Wallace's example in which a person seeks out the last liquor store in the city still open at this time of night to get some whisky he knows he should not be drinking. This action requires complex instrumental reasoning from the intention to get the drink to further intentions concerning means and more specific courses of action. The desire to drink has none of the functional roles that the intention to drink does. So, even by Bratman's theory of intention, which Chan accepts, many akratic actions like the one in Wallace's example should be viewed as intended.

Second, on Chan's view, intention is the result of practical reasoning. Practical reasoning is deliberation about what intention to form or what intentional action to perform. Suppose the akratic agent deliberates practically and reaches the conclusion that he should not intend to drink. Now if he does not form this intention, and his drinking is not intentional, why would he be violating the conclusion of his practical reasoning by drinking? Surely the desire to perform the akratic action is not sufficient to make sense of the irrationality involved in akrasia. We should view his action as intentional in order to explain why he is irrational.

Akratic agency, therefore, casts doubt on (b). Why does Chan accept (b)? The only argument I found in support of (b) is the following:

If intentions are always formed through practical reasoning, then the actions that follow from intentions are always aimed at the object of some desire. If, on the contrary, an intention can arise spontaneously, how is it that the intention could be goal-directed? How does intention latch onto a state of affairs, and motivate the agent to bring it about unless there is something to be said in favor of that state of affairs? (p.39)

But this argument is flawed in several ways. The obvious flaw is that it does not yield the conclusion that intention needs practical reasoning. It, at most, shows that intention requires a desire for the object of intention. The argument does not show that the desire for the action must override other reasons not to perform the action.

There is also another problem. To desire something is not sufficient for one to be committed to bringing it about. It seems rational for one to desire something and yet do nothing toward getting what one desires. However, it is not possible for one to have an intention and do nothing, or have no commitment, to realize the object of the intention. It is a conceptual truth that to have an intention involves an attempt to execute it, or at least a commitment to the execution (see Amir Saemi 2015). If desire does not, and intention does, involve a commitment to bringing about its object, why would a desire imply a commitment to execution? (Let me also note that Chan's argument for (b) does not apply to intentional actions which express emotions without having a goal).

I conclude that Chan provides no good argument to support (b) and given that akratic actions are a counterexample to it, we should reject (b). This undermines Chan's motivation for introducing the category of non-intentional action.

II. Desire and the Doctrine of Double Effect

The Doctrine of Double Effect (DDE) says that harming someone intentionally is generally harder to justify than harming someone as a merely foreseen side effect of something else one does intentionally. Chan denies DDE on the grounds that knowingly doing something amounts to intending to do it. Discussing the cases of Strategic Bomber (SB) and Terror Bomber (TB), Chan wants to "argue that SB, like TB, is in the state of mind that satisfies the criteria for intending to kill the children . . . it is impossible to find a sense of "intend" such that only TB intends to kill the children." (p.174). The following is Chan's argument for the claim:

If SB has decided that it is still best to bomb the plant given that he is certain to kill the children, he is settled on killing them. Not only that, but if he can best locate the plant by looking for the children, it would be irrational of him not to track the children and guide his action by targeting the children. (pp.175-6)

It is implausible that all known side-effects are intended. Suppose you shoot an aggressor in self-defense. There is a bystander whom you know would be deafened by the sound of your shooting. Did you intend to deafen him? Of course not. You did not intend to deafen him even if you were certain that you would deafen him, and even if his being deafened is a reliable sign that you shot the aggressor. From the fact that you know there is a correlation between a side-effect and the intended effect, it does not follow that your behavior is guided by the side-effect. You're guided by a goal when you adjust your behavior in a range of close possible worlds to ensure that you will achieve the goal. SB would not kill the children in a close possible world where they evacuate the plant, whereas TB would still kill them even if they evacuate the plant. TB is guided by the goal of killing the children, but SB is not. What about Chan's claim that given that SB can track the children to locate the plant, he must have the intention to kill them? I think there is an intuitive point lurking behind Chan's claim but the point does not vindicate his claim. Consider the following case:

Tracking-Bomber (TrB). Tracking Bomber's mission is to destroy the munitions plant, but he knows that there are children in the plant. For some peculiar reasons, TrB has no way to know that the plant is destroyed except by ascertaining that the children are killed.

TrB's killing of the children is intentional. Not only does TrB want to bomb the plant, he also wants to know that he has destroyed it, and to acquire this knowledge, ex hypothesis, he has to know that he has killed the children. Killing the children is a means for TrB's epistemic goal, and is thus intended. Consider the possible world where the children evacuate the plant and so the correlation between killing the children and destroying the plant does not hold any more. We assumed that TrB had no epistemic access to the plant, except through the children. In that possible world, TrB would still believe that killing of children is the only reliable sign of destroying the plant, and thus he would still bomb them. This shows that he is guided by the children. However, SB is not TrB. To know that he has destroyed the plant, SB does not need to know that the children are killed. Even if the presence of the children is evidence for the presence of the plant, SB is not dependent on it; he would not go after the children if they were to leave the plant. The important question is whether tracking the supposed "side-effect" is necessary to know that the intended effect is achieved. If so, the "side-effect" is intended. If not, the side-effect is neither epistemically nor instrumentally necessary for the intended effect and thus not intended. The classic cases to which DDE applies (such as strategic bombing), are cases where the side-effect is neither epistemically nor instrumentally necessary for the intended effect.

Chan discusses the counterfactual difference between SB and TB.

Defenders of [the DDE] have tried to show that agents such as SB do not intend the bad side-effect by applying what has been called the "counterfactual test". It is suggested that SB would react differently from TB if told that the children would not be killed as a result of the bombing . . . However, if the counterfactual situation is one where the only change is that the children did not die, TB would not necessarily scrap the bombing mission. For it is conceivable that he would defeat the enemy simply by bringing it about that the children appear dead . . . Thus the test fails to show that TB differs from SB in having an intention to kill the children. (p.179)

Chan here refers to the so-called problem of closeness. However, it is very odd that Chan thinks the closeness problem gives any support to his claim that SB intends the bad effect. Surely defenders of the DDE should provide a response to the closeness problem. Some claim that it is impossible to intend to bomb the children and tear their bodies apart without intending to kill them (e.g. Matthew Hanser, 2000), others claim that even if TB does not intend to kill the children, he intends to involve them in a harmful event (e.g. Warren S. Quinn, 1989). However, no matter how we approach the closeness problem, it gives absolutely no support to Chan's claim that SB intends the bad effect. Even Jonathan Bennett, who raised the closeness problem as a serious problem for the DDE, would accept that SB does not intend to kill the children or make them appear dead for that matter, whereas TB intends to make children appear dead.

Chan's proposal to reformulate DDE in terms of desire looks even stranger.

DDEd [i.e. the DDE in terms of desire], in contrast to the DDEi [i.e. the DDE in terms of intention] can be stated as follows.

It may be more permissible (or less morally objectionable) to knowingly bring about (or allow) some bad effect in achieving some good end, given that the bad effect is undesired (or the avoidance of the bad effect is strongly desired), than to knowingly bring about (or allow) a similar bad effect (partly or wholly) for the reason that one desires the bad effect, as means, end or side-effect (or that one does not desire as strongly to avoid it). (p.180)

One reason that Chan's proposal looks strange is that it does not formally parallel the traditional DDE. DDE is a non-consequentialist constraint against intentional harming according to which there is a moral distinction between intention and foresight when the contrast cases are consequentially equivalent (i.e. the same amount of goods is achieved at the expense of bringing about the same amount of bad effects). However, the contrast cases stated in DDEd are not consequentially equivalent. For DDEd does not say that the bad effect is desired for the sake of some greater good. DDEd seems to compare apples and oranges.

Chan claims that DDEd can explain the contrast between SB and TB.

DDEd has a sound rationale. Although both SB's and TB's practical reasoning issued in intentions to kill the children, the inputs into their reasoning are different. SB may have a stronger desire not to kill the children that prevents him choosing terror bombing, whereas in similar circumstances, any desire that TB has not to kill the children is too weak to prevent him from choosing the action as a means to demoralize the enemy. (p.182)

The relevant difference between TB and SB, according to Chan, lies in the fact that SB has a stronger desire not to kill the children than TB does. However, to evaluate the difference between TB and SB, we should make the cases consequentially equivalent. In the both cases, the act of bombing has the same good effect of ending the war, and the same number of children would be killed by the agents' actions. The moral difference between TB and SB remains even if they equally desire the good outcome and equally desire not to kill the children. But then why should we suppose, as Chan does, that SB's desire to kill the children is stronger than TB's to the extent that it prevents him from choosing terror bombing? Terror bombing and strategic bombing are two different ways that SB could satisfy his desire to end the war. Why should we think that SB chooses strategic bombing, but not terror bombing, given that they have the same consequences? If SB chooses strategic bombing and not terror bombing, it should be because there is a moral difference in these two different actions. But if these actions have different moral properties, it must be because the traditional DDE is correct in marking a difference between the two actions. Therefore, for DDEd to be able to explain the difference between SB and TB, we must assume that the traditional DDE is right (and that there are instrumental desires—which Chan denies in other parts of the book). DDEd alone cannot explain the difference between TB and SB.

In sum, I find some claims of the book questionable. Nevertheless, it is very clearly written and its arguments are thought-provoking and instructive. This is enough to make Chan's book a valuable contribution to contemporary philosophy of action.


Hanser, M. (2000). Intention and accident. Philosophical studies98(1), pp.15-34.

Moran, R., Stone, M. (2009). Anscombe on expression of intention. In New Essays on the Explanation of Action. Macmillan. pp.132-168.

Quinn, W.S. (1989). Actions, intentions, and consequences: The doctrine of double effect. Philosophy and Public Affairs, pp.334-351.

Saemi, A. (2015). Aiming at the good. Canadian Journal of Philosophy45(2), pp.197-219.

Thompson, M. (2008). Life and action. Harvard University Press.

Wallace, R.J. (2001). Normativity, commitment, and instrumental reason. Philosophers' Imprint1(3), pp.1-26.