Actions and Objects from Hobbes to Richardson

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Jonathan Kramnick, Actions and Objects from Hobbes to Richardson, Stanford University Press, 2010, 307pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780804770521.

Reviewed by Samuel C. Rickless, University of California, San Diego


When I was asked to review this book, I was not expecting to be drawn into discussion about the relation between epiphenomenalism and premature ejaculation. Oh well. I'll get to that in a minute, but for now you'll just have to wait …

The guiding idea of Jonathan Kramnick's book is that some prominent philosophical themes in the work of Lucretius, Bramhall, Hobbes, Locke, Clarke, and Hume found their way into the (pornographic) poetry of John Wilmot, Earl of Rochester, and the novels of Eliza Haywood and Samuel Richardson. According to the standard view of literary development in seventeenth- and eighteenth-century Britain, the period witnessed "a new language of inwardness or subjectivity" (2). Kramnick's purpose is to "complicate this thesis by pointing to the largely unacknowledged role of external factors in the period's conception of mind" (2). Rochester, we are told, relies on Lucretian atomism and Hobbesian materialism to eliminate the person as the locus of states of mind, and then to eliminate mental states altogether (85, 117). He also adopts epiphenomenalism (100) and a version of presentism according to which objects (particularly, persons) exist only in a kind of impossible present (16). Haywood, so it is argued, relies on externalist features of Locke's theory of consent to represent this state of mind in her novels as "a property of what one is doing, or where one is, or whom one is with" (177). And Richardson, it appears, provides us with dueling accounts of the nature of action embodied in two characters, one (Clarissa's) according to which actions are always preceded and caused by intentions (so that there is no action in the absence of an intention to act [195]), the will is free (209), and consent has a world-to-mind direction of fit (211); and its opposite (Lovelace's) according to which intentions are constituted by actions (214), the will is necessitated by a person's environment (216), and consent has a mind-to-world direction of fit (214). Partly preceding, and occasionally interspersed among, these discussions, we find summary and reconstruction of the debate between the compatibilist Hobbes and the incompatibilist Bramhall (28-38, 209), the debate between the compatibilist Collins and the incompatibilist Clarke (38-48, 209), the views of Hume on liberty, will and action (48-58, 210-211), and Locke's views on personal identity (85-97).

There is something potentially exciting and refreshing in the thought that theories and distinctions developed by philosophers might help us gain a better understanding of classic literary works. And, to his credit, Kramnick (with few exceptions) does a good job of summarizing the main theses of the philosophers whose works he considers. For a scholar who is not trained as a historian of philosophy, and so not necessarily attuned to all the relevant interpretive debates in the secondary literature, that is no mean feat. Kramnick is clearly very familiar with all the primary sources and has read them conscientiously and carefully.

However, methodologically speaking, why suppose that the authors of the literary works Kramnick discusses were aware of, or alive to, the theories and ideas described by their philosophical predecessors and contemporaries? Kramnick says little here, and what he does say is not persuasive. He tells us that he "moves freely between what in retrospect we would call philosophical and literary writing," that he takes "great pleasure in the nonexistence of this distinction in the eighteenth century," and that he views the "overlap of [literary and philosophical] concerns as permission to stipulate a relation between texts that have grown to seem far-flung." His method, then, is to "track allusion, citation, and debate, but in the main … to follow the appearance and movement of problems" (11).

But the kind of overlap that Kramnick finds is meager evidence indeed that the relevant literary figures were even aware of, let alone concerned to display their knowledge of, the philosophical views at issue in the book. Kramnick points to the fact that Hume reports his ruling passion to be a "love of literary fame" and that Richardson characterizes his own work as involving "instantaneous Descriptions and Reflections" (11). But these reports do not establish that Rochester, Haywood, and Richardson were using philosophical tropes in their works, and the claim that the abstract views of Bramhall, Hobbes, and others on will, action, and freedom made their way into the poetry and novels of the period is pure speculation at best. To secure such a claim, one would need to find evidence (whether in published works or private correspondence) that the relevant literary figures knew and understood the relevant philosophical debates, and that they cared about them sufficiently for them to have some sort of impact on their creative projects. But Kramnick does not present or point to such evidence. The book therefore reads as if written by someone who found some interesting concepts in seventeenth- and eighteenth-century philosophy and simply decided to apply them, in accordance with Humean principles of mental association, as interpretive tools. The problem with this is that, while stipulative association works well in the province of creative writing, it is poorly suited to the scholarly enterprise of literary criticism.

When we turn to the particular connections Kramnick sees between the philosophy and literature of the period, we find two main problems. The first is that Kramnick's grasp of some important philosophical theories is confused. The second, and more important for his purposes, is that his interpretation of the relevant literary works is belied by the texts. It is not possible for me to discuss all the claims that Kramnick makes about Rochester, Haywood, and Richardson. So I will focus on a few representative parts of his interpretation.

Consider the lessons that Kramnick tries to draw from a comparison of two translations of a portion of Lucretius's On the Nature of Things, the first by Thomas Creech (1682) and the second by Rochester:

1 For every Deity must live in peace, 2 In undisturb'd and everlasting ease, 3 Not care for us, from fears and dangers free, 4 Sufficient to His own felicity.

1 The Gods, by right of Nature, must possess 2 An Everlasting Age, of Perfect Peace: 3 Far off remov'd from us, and our Affairs: 4 Neither approach'd by Dangers, or by Cares.

As Kramnick sees it, Rochester's lines indicate that "the various thoughts and feelings belong to no one in particular." For example, if we compare the third and fourth lines of both versions, we find that Rochester replaces "the mental state of 'not caring'" by "the spatial relation of being 'far off remov'd'", and replaces "the Gods experiencing felicity" with "dangers and cares lurking on their own" (81). But this is absurd. As often happens in poetic translations of poetry, the content of line N sometimes gets rendered in line N+1 or N-1. In this particular case, line 3 of Creech's translation corresponds to line 4 (not line 3) of Rochester's, and line 4 of Creech's translation corresponds to line 3 (not line 4) of Rochester's.

As Kramnick sees it, Rochester's translation of some lines of Seneca reveals that he "finds in matter a kind of insentience" (81), and thus counts as an eliminativist (85). But what Seneca says, in Rochester's version, is that "Dead, we become the Lumber of the World" (82), which means at best no more than that dead matter is insentient. Kramnick claims that in A Satyr Against Reason and Mankind, Rochester "outlines a version of epiphenomenalism in which states of mind either lag behind or are indistinguishable from the machinelike workings of the body" (100). Here Kramnick betrays his (recurring) inability to distinguish among eliminativism (according to which there are no mental states), epiphenomenalism (according to which mental states, but not physical states, are causally inert), and reductionism (according to which mental states are physical states -- states that are not causally inert). Worse, the Satyr reveals absolutely no commitment to eliminativism, epiphenomenalism, or reductionism. The point of the Satyr, instead, is that sense and instinct are better guides in life than reason. It is in this sense that Rochester characterizes reason as an "Ignis Fatuus of the Mind" (101); and it is for this reason that Rochester tells us that "Thoughts are given for Actions government/ Where action ceases, Thought's impertinent" (103). This is a philosophical thesis of a sort; but it has nothing to do with the issue of mental causation.

The absurdity of Kramnick's interpretation of Rochester comes to a head in his reconstruction of The Imperfect Enjoyment, "one of literary history's more celebrated evocations of impotence" (113). To Kramnick, the point of the poem is to establish that "the mind proves altogether unable to provoke the body" (113). Now I can see why one would think that impotence might indicate the causal inertness of mental states. As Rochester puts it: "I sigh alas! And Kiss, but cannot swive" (115): that is, the intention to swive does not succeed in producing the desired effect. But there are two significant problems with Kramnick's interpretation. The first is that the poem establishes at most that some mental states are causally inert. It would be a serious leap to infer from this the epiphenomenalist thesis that all mental states are causally inert, and there is no evidence that Rochester himself makes this mistake. Worse, there is strong textual evidence that the poem actually presupposes the existence of mental causation! For Rochester writes that "Eager desires Confound the first intent, / Succeeding shame does more success prevent / And Rage at last Confirms me Impotent" (115). In the end, then, Kramnick's interpretation of Rochester's poetry is both philosophically incoherent and contradicted by the relevant texts themselves.

In his discussion of Haywood's novels, Kramnick turns to the notion of consent. Kramnick's main thesis here is that, in such works as Love in Excess and Fantomina, Haywood borrows an externalist view of consent from Locke (176). By externalism, Kramnick means that "states of mind are outside the head" (193), in the various ways defended by Hilary Putnam, Andy Clark, and Alva NoĆ« (235-36). But here again, there is historical inaccuracy, philosophical confusion, and lack of textual mooring. Philosophically, Kramnick fails to distinguish between the metaphysical thesis that mental states are externalistically individuated and the epistemic thesis that the evidence for (some) mental states is often (or always) behavioral, and so in some sense "external". This confusion leads Kramnick to mistakenly attribute an externalist theory of tacit consent to Locke, a philosopher according to whom behavior discloses, but certainly does not create or constitute, states of mind (175). This historical mistake is then transferred to the textual interpretation of Haywood's novels. For example, when Haywood writes that Amena's "panting heart beat measures of consent" to further intimacy with the rakish D'elmont, she does not mean that Amena's consent is constituted in some way by the increased rapidity of her heartbeats or by some sort of relation to her environment; she means simply that Amena's panting heart betrays or reveals the relevant form of consent. As Haywood puts the point: "he found … every pulse confess a wish to yield" (177).

Kramnick's discussion of Richardson's Clarissa focuses on "the ontology of actions: when they start and stop, whether they have parts, how they realize intentions or entail responsibility" (194). The basic facts of Clarissa are clear. Clarissa's family wants her to marry Solmes. She repeatedly refuses to do so. For complex reasons, she keeps up a hidden correspondence with the rake, Lovelace. Eventually, they arrange to meet, and on the spur of the moment, Clarissa agrees to fly off with Lovelace. He then keeps her as his mistress against her will and rapes her. She then dies of an unspecified cause. Kramnick asks (1) whether actions are always preceded by and caused by intentions, (2) whether the will is free, and (3) whether consent has a world-to-mind direction of fit. His main thesis is that Clarissa answers these questions in the affirmative, while Lovelace answers them in the negative.

Consider the textual evidence bearing on the first question. Kramnick argues that Clarissa's insistence that she has not done anything because she has not intended to do anything, and hence cannot reasonably be blamed by her family for anything she has done, indicates that she would provide a positive answer to (1). But this is confused. It is true, of course, that Clarissa does not conceive of her refusal to marry Solmes as "an action taken against" her family (205). But it does not follow from this, nor does Clarissa anywhere say, that her refusal to marry Solmes is not an action at all. It may well be that Clarissa believes that all actions are caused by intentions, but it is wrong to suppose that she thinks this even in part because she conceives of herself as without intentions and completely inactive.

On the question of free will, Kramnick argues that Clarissa takes herself to be free, while Lovelace takes her to be unfree because necessitated by features of her environment over which she has no control. But this is to assume that Lovelace is a kind of incompatibilist, and no evidence is provided for this hypothesis. Reference to Richardson's predecessors does not help here, of course, because, as Kramnick rightly notes, these predecessors divide over the truth of incompatibilism, with Bramhall and Clarke taking it to be true, and Hobbes, Locke, and Collins taking it to be false. And on the question of consent, Kramnick's claim that Lovelace takes consent to have a mind-to-world direction of fit results from his earlier inability to distinguish the nature of consent from the evidence for its existence. Kramnick writes that "on Lovelace's reading, … Clarissa's leaving home, passing as his wife, and moving to London means that she has already consented" (214). But "means" here is ambiguous. Understood epistemically (as "indicates"), Kramnick's claim is accurate. But Kramnick wants us to understand the claim metaphysically (as "constitutes the fact"), otherwise his reference to Lovelace's externalism (214) would be inapposite. But there is no evidence that it is better to read Lovelace as holding a metaphysical, as opposed to a more quotidian epistemic, thesis.

In some ways, Kramnick's aims are laudable and his achievements impressive. Despite not having been trained as a professional philosopher, he has assimilated a great deal of historical material that bears on contemporary issues in the philosophy of action and mind. It is also refreshing to bring philosophy to bear on literary criticism. I am certainly not opposed in principle to this sort of interdisciplinarity. I am sure that philosophers have much to learn from literary theorists, and vice-versa. But the drawbacks of Kramnick's book illustrate two morals that interdisciplinary literary critics should take to heart before launching themselves into a different discipline: first, that it is important to avoid confusion that derives from insufficient or inadequate disciplinary training, and second, that it is better, all things considered, to bring other disciplines to bear on literary issues to which they bear some real, potentially elucidatory connection.