Active Perception in the History of Philosophy: From Plato to Modern Philosophy

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José Filipe Silva and Mikko Yrjönsuuri (eds.), Active Perception in the History of Philosophy: From Plato to Modern Philosophy, Springer, 2014, 293pp., $129.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783319043609.

Reviewed by Han Thomas Adriaenssen, University of Groningen


The fifteen papers in this collection focus on the basic idea that perception is an activity -- something we do rather than something we undergo. This intuition may perhaps seem obvious to philosophers and psychologists nowadays, most of whom would agree that perceiving involves a lot more than passively receiving stimuli from without. But, as the editors point out, it is not an intuition that may be taken for granted. Rather, it is an intuition that developed over time, and to trace its emergence in the history of philosophy is one of the volume's principal aims. Doing this, José Filipe Silva and Mikko Yrjönsuuri claim, will help add 'a historical understanding' to modern talk of active perception (2).

The volume consists of three sets of papers: one on ancient, one on medieval, and one on early modern philosophy. The majority of the essays focus on early modern thought, but the contributors have often made a valuable effort to explain how modern philosophers' views on sensory perception compare to those of their medieval predecessors. The thinkers considered include major figures such as Plato, Augustine, and Kant, but also lesser known philosophers like Pseudo-Simplicius, William of Auvergne, and Bernardino Telesio. Since most of the papers succeed in catering for specialists and non-specialists alike, this wide array makes the volume an interesting source for students of the history of theories of perceptual cognition. In what follows, I will first make some general remarks about the book and then single out some papers for more detailed discussion rather than going over each individually.

Though I think the volume's broad scope is an asset, it also produces some problems. Most obviously, it is difficult, if not impossible, to clearly mark out a conception of active perception that all the figures studied would have agreed on. Augustine and Kant, for instance, may both have stressed that perception is active, but activity surely meant something rather different for Kant than it did for Augustine. The editors recognize this, and so refrain from giving a precise and exhaustive definition of active perception. Rather, they propose that 'Active perception is to be understood in a wide sense so as to include any account that takes perception to be the result of the soul's own agency' (3).

This intentionally broad definition certainly seems liberal enough to do justice to the ideas of the many thinkers discussed. In fact, it is liberal to the point that it becomes hard to think of a philosopher who denies that perception is an active process. Few thinkers, after all, would deny that perception is in some sense 'the result of the soul's own agency'. While Silva and Yrjönsuuri do not go on to extensively discuss this point, I think some more explicit reflection on their rather inclusive notion of active perception would have been helpful.

That the editors cast their net so wide with their description of active perception may well be a reflection of the idea that, in the end, there is no easy and clear-cut distinction between active and passive theories of perceptual cognition. This, at any rate, is a point that many of the contributors make. Thus, although Aristotle, Descartes, and Locke sometimes appear to think of perception as an essentially passive affair, Klaus Corcilius, Miira Tuominen, Cecilia Wee, and Vili Lähteenmäki convincingly show that this simple picture needs shading. Gary Hatfield ('Activity and Passivity in Theories of Perception: Descartes to Kant') similarly makes the point that for many historical figures, ordinary perception involves both some degree of receptivity and some sort of activity undertaken by the subject of cognition. If there is a distinction between active and passive theories of perception to be drawn, the volume thus suggests, it will have to be a gradual rather than a principled one. Accordingly, to say that a particular thinker holds an active theory of sense perception will normally mean that this thinker puts more emphasis on the active elements of perceptual experience than on its passive elements.

Given that this seems to be one of the volume's main lessons, it is perhaps a pity that it offers no extensive discussion of a major Aristotelian thinker like Thomas Aquinas. To be sure, the medieval period is far from neglected. But since many of the contributors attempt to dispel 'passivity myths' about figures like Aristotle and Descartes, it would have been useful to have a discussion of what to make of Aquinas' claims that all cognition amounts to the reception of forms, and that, accordingly, 'perceiving is a kind of undergoing (quoddam pati)'.

The first set of papers concentrates on ancient thought. Pauliina Remes and Corcilius discuss Plato and Aristotle respectively, while Tuominen ('On Activity and Passivity in Perception: Aristotle, Philoponus, and Pseudo-Simplicius') explores the accounts of sense perception in some of Aristotle's Neoplatonic commentators. Tuominen shows that, for Pseudo-Simplicius, perception involves the reception of a form by a sense organ. So far, then, perceiving amounts to receiving information from without. But, as Tuominen explains, Pseudo-Simplicius does not believe that this is the whole story since after the organ has been affected, the immaterial soul responds by projecting the relevant conceptual content on this affection, thus playing an active role in the constitution of sensory awareness (76). To the extent that perception involves both the reception of a form by an organ and some conceptual engagement on behalf of the soul, then, it is neither completely passive nor totally active.

The papers on medieval philosophy are nicely balanced between Western and Islamic traditions. Jean-Baptiste Brenet explores the intriguing idea, going back to Averroes, that, just as intellectual cognition involves the mediation of an agent intellect, perception involves the mediation of an agent sense. Jari Kaukua ('Avicenna on the Soul's Activity in Perception') makes more nuanced the view that, for Aristotelian thinkers, the perceptual soul is a passive receptacle of sensory information. Thus, while acknowledging that Avicenna 'subscribed to the view that perception is by and large a passive affair' (99), Kaukua goes on to argue that, for Avicenna, the common sense and the estimation play important roles in enriching and structuring the sensory data we receive from without.

The two contributions by Silva explore active perception in the Augustinian tradition. In 'Augustine on Active Perception', he discusses Augustine's definition of perception from On the Quantity of the Soul. In this work, Augustine argues that perception is 'an effect on the body that does not escape the awareness of the soul' (81). Augustine stresses that physical objects cannot themselves impinge on the immaterial soul. Their causal impact is limited to our organs, and conscious perception accordingly takes place when the soul attends to the body it 'inhabits'.

This account of perception, Silva explains in 'Medieval Theories of Active Perception: An Overview', stood at the origin of the 'excitation theories' that one finds in later medieval authors, such as William of Auvergne, John Peckham, and Matthew of Aquasparta. According to these thinkers, external objects would affect our bodies, and these affections, once taken notice of by the soul, would excite it to actively bring forth representations pertaining to external objects. According to William, for example, the embodied soul is like a spider in its web. Just as the mere vibrations of the filaments of its web excite the spider to conceive of a prey, the soul is excited to generate a representation when the body is affected from without.

Silva's presentation is generally lucid and informative, and he does a good job of synthesizing rich scholastic discussions. At the same time, the synthesis occasionally comes at the expense of recognizing the differences between the authors discussed. For example, when John Peckham speaks of excitation, part of what he wants this notion to explain is how perceptual cognition of our environment works. But when William of Auvergne discusses excitation, this typically occurs in the context of the following question: how do our souls come to form quidditative concepts, given that all information we receive through the senses regards the sensory accidents of things? William's answer is that the reception of sensory information instinctively excites the soul to form the relevant sort of concept. In this respect, it is like the spider that instinctively conceives of an as yet unseen prey on the occasion of the vibrations of its web. When speaking of excitation, then, William's main focus is on the leap from experienced accidents to the formation of quidditative concepts. The mechanisms of sense perception as such, by contrast, are not his primary concern. This raises the question of how William's talk of excitation relates to similar talk by thinkers like Peckham. But bracketing such questions for the moment, Silva's paper on the whole is a valuable contribution to our understanding of scholastic Augustinians who, though by no means household names, certainly deserve more attention than they often get.

The contributions on early modern philosophy again show that the passivity or activity of perception hardly is an all-or-nothing affair. Thus, as Wee argues in her 'Descartes and Active Perception', the fact that Descartes sometimes speaks of 'the passive power of sensory perception (AT VII 80, CSM II 55) is potentially misleading. To make this clear, she distinguishes between two senses of passivity. In the first, something is passive insofar as it is a patient undergoing an action. In this sense, perception is never fully passive, insofar as Descartes takes the perception of, for example, a stick, to involve the formation of a judgment that enables a subject to see the object in front of him as a stick. To the extent that every act of perceiving involves the formation of such a judgment, the soul is an agent rather than a patient. In the second sense, something is passive insofar as it is non-volitional. The fact that Descartes in the Fourth Meditation holds judgments to be acts of will thus would seem to suggest that perceptions, in virtue of being informed by judgments, involve some sort of volition, making them active rather than passive in the second sense, too. But Wee resists this conclusion. Affirmations and denials admittedly involve acts of will, but the mere formation of judgments involves the intellect only. Hence, the mere fact that the intellect forms judgments that enable me to see the object in front of me as a stick does not show that perception involves volitional acts. In the end, therefore, perception may be 'volitionally passive' (220). This is an interesting suggestion, but Wee's argument is a bit compressed, and it does raise questions. For one thing, could the mere formation of judgments ever lead me to perceive something as a stick unless I actually assented to these judgments? To see an object as a stick involves the formation of judgments about the shape and size of that object, we are told, but would I not have to assent to these judgments if they are to make me see the thing in front of me as a stick? If so, there would seem to be room for volitional activity in Descartes's account of sense perception after all.

On the whole, then, this book is a valuable source for students and scholars interested in the history of philosophical psychology. Most of the papers are accessible to a broad audience. Many of the contributors interestingly qualify the idea that there is a clear-cut distinction to be made between passive and active accounts of perception.