Acts: Theater, Philosophy, and the Performing Self

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Tzachi Zamir, Acts: Theater, Philosophy, and the Performing Self, University of Michigan Press, 2014, 278pp., $36.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780472052134.

Reviewed by Nick Riggle, University of San Diego


Recent work at the intersection of philosophy of action and aesthetics has unearthed rich territory. We are deepening our appreciation for and understanding of the role of pretense, imagination, and narrative (to name a few) in human action and moral psychology. Tzachi Zamir’s book investigates a relatively unexplored locus of overlap between philosophy of action and aesthetics via a multifaceted and conceptually rich study of the art, ethics, and moral psychology of acting — topics that have received scant philosophical attention (with some exceptions, including James Hamilton’s excellent work). How should we conceive of what the actor does? Why, if the actor does well, can it result in something we enjoy and encourage? How does the art of acting relate to other arts (e.g. literature)? What are the ethical implications of acting, properly conceived, inside and outside of the theater?

These are some of the central questions Zamir’s book addresses in four parts. Part I, Life on the Stage, develops Zamir’s conceptually rich account of the art of acting; Part II, Staging Fictions, explores this account by using it to analyze various parts of theatrical events, e.g. the actor’s intonation, and the staging of literature and theatrical objects; Part III, Between Life and Stage, considers the impact of acting on the actor’s life and brings these considerations to bear on a fascinating discussion of pornographic performance; Part IV, Life as Stage, looks beyond the stage at ways in which ‘self-theatricalization’ occurs in our dealings with love and death via studies of masochism and anorexia.

The first step in answering the question ‘What is acting?’ is to say that, generally, the actor is not entirely (if at all) what she presents herself as being. There is a disconnect between the person the actor is and the one she presents. But there are many ways of filling this out, and acting is not the only agential domain it describes: consider costume, masquerade, or fraudulence. At a glance, acting may be a matter of:

·      Pretending to be another person.

·      Mimicking or imitating another person.

·      Playing out a conception of oneself as another person.

·      Imaginatively immersing oneself in a role.

·      Becoming a different person.

Each raises questions of its own: what is imaginative immersion? What is the relevant conception of a person? And they can be combined in various ways: the actor might pretend to be another person with the aim of becoming that person; she might mimic another person by way of pretending to be her; she might become a different person by imaginatively immersing herself in a role; and so on.

The heart of Zamir’s approach to these difficult questions is a conceptually complex theory of acting that requires a considerable amount of unpacking. “Acting,” he writes, “is an aesthetically controlled embodied imaginative transformation.” (12) He clarifies in a footnote that this is meant as a necessary and sufficient condition. As such, it includes “a parent pretending to be a roaring lion for a delighted toddler” and excludes many ways of being involved in theatrical events, e.g. playing a prop-like background role (219).

“Aesthetic control” concerns the relation between what the actor does and the response that such action merits. A well timed fall, for example, merits laughter. On Zamir’s view, actors are essentially attentive to such relations even if the audience — who might just laugh at the fall without noting the perfect timing — isn’t.

Zamir’s concept of “embodied transformation” is the real heavy lifter, and he explicates it with yet another (intriguing) notion, namely, “existential amplification”. The most significant feature of acting, Zamir holds, is that it allows us to expand our sense of being alive. “Acting,” he writes, “is a gateway to living more,” (17) and “Actors . . . amplify their own lives by imaginatively embodying alien existential possibilities.” (18) One of the many virtues of Zamir’s book is his attentiveness to the experience of acting, both from his own experience and from the reports of seasoned actors, critics, and theorists. Existential amplification is supposed to capture (at least a central feature of) what the actor seeks and gains from the experience of acting and what captivates the audience when experiencing it.

Understanding Zamir’s concept of amplification requires, in turn, a gloss on his view of persons. “A person is a cluster of possibilities, and actualizes a small portion of these. Graphically, our lives resemble a pyramid: we are what we can become”. (17) Acting is, in part, the art of manipulating this “cluster” of possibilities. Though Zamir could be clearer about this, it seems that his focus is on ways of representing or understanding oneself. My sense of self is my sense of what is possible for me. Thus, I might conceive of myself as a set of possibilities plus some path through collections of those that I have and could have actualized, those that I do actualize, and those that I could actualize. We can represent my sense of self as follows, where the actualized possibilities are in italics:

NR:  . . . went to school in Riverside, went to school in Santa Rosa; played tennis in his teens, was a skater in his teens; owns a skate shop in San Francisco, is a philosophy professor; could become a surfer, could publish a book review . . .

Existential amplification, and so acting, involves “amplifying” or “expanding” this representation. Notice that this notion of self-expansion or amplification is theoretically loaded. There’s an option that seems to be excluded by the very notion, which is that I create a stand-in self-representation. Perhaps I conceive in detail some other person and make-believe that this person is myself, leaving my non-fictional self-representation unmodified (and so unexpanded). Zamir’s model implicitly rejects such a conception by holding that, in acting, one’s original sense of self is amplified. But the other option seems to me a live possibility, and I would have liked some defense of this early move. Consider the fact that Zamir regards a paradigmatic case of make-believe as acting: the parent pretending to be a lion. But it’s not obvious that we should regard such action as even potentially involving self-expansion.

Zamir discusses three aspects of amplification. The most obvious is “content-oriented” amplification, wherein we add fictional content to our set of possibilities. When I act the role of, say, Alexander the Great, I add to NR to create NR-Act:

NR-Act: grew up in Ancient Macedonia; went to school in Riverside, went to school in Santa Rosa, was tutored by Aristotle; played tennis in his teens, was a skater in his teens, learned to ride and hunt in his teens; owns a skate shop in San Francisco, is a philosophy professor, is an ambitious military leader on a campaign through Asia; could perish in the next battle, could publish a book review . . .

Another aspect of amplification is “self-animation,” which concerns the degree to which the fictional content is embodied. Consider what is packed into the term “self-animation”: animation is either a state of liveliness or, roughly, an illusion of sentience (or at least movement). In the context of dramatic acting, then, “self-animation” suggests that the actor animates a self or creates the illusion that she is moved by a certain self. This can be more-or-less successful; Zamir identifies full success with the “energy” or “inspiration” we admire in great acting. The third aspect of amplification is “disembodiment”: “An actor’s work into an alien role is, simultaneously, a migration from his biographical embodiment.” (25)

This third aspect raises the question of how acting affects the non-fictional content of NR-Act (the content it shares with NR). Zamir’s notion of amplification suggests that we don’t delete it — we must amplify what is there. And the notion of disembodiment suggests that we largely ignore it: acting involves, “a process of withdrawal from daily embodiment”. (25) And insofar as my self-representations guide and color my actions — inflecting my patterns of speech, modulating my gestures and responses — I must downplay or ignore those contents of NR-Act that would make for unsuccessful acting if I were to act from them. Of course, we can’t ignore those contents completely, for some serve to remind us of the distinction between fiction and reality, moral and immoral, and thereby prevent us from performing actions that we might otherwise be compelled to perform (to fly if we were playing a superhero; to kill if we were playing a murderer).

But I found myself wanting more detail about disembodiment, particularly as it concerns the relation between the mechanics of acting and the “existential” upshot Zamir claims for it. If acting is to have a self-expanding upshot, then disembodiment cannot be too severe. NR’s real self must remain in view — not just as a background check on self- or other-harming action, but more substantially.

So how exactly does my practice with NR-Act shed existential light on NR? One thought is that acting gets us to see ourselves as the character we’re portraying, in the way that a good metaphor can get us to see or understand one thing as another. But that won’t seem to work because metaphors work only if there’s substantial similarity between the objects of comparison. If my “disembodiment” were very extreme, I would risk distancing myself too radically from facts about my real self that the acting could illuminate. But some acting projects seem to require such extreme forms of “disembodiment” that any existential amplification seems impossible. Zamir seems to admit as much when he discusses the ethics of acting: “imaginatively reaching out into other possibilities of being may also weaken one’s hold over the single possibility that makes up one’s actual identity.” (145) The metaphor of weakening one’s hold over one’s identity suggests that acting can make us uncertain about who we are. In such cases, how is one “amplified” rather than diminished or effaced? This tension between disembodiment and amplification suggests that some acting projects cannot have the existential upshot Zamir claims for acting and so cannot provide the thespian goods he lauds. And if that’s right, one wonders whether it is true that existential amplification is a kind of keystone in the theory of acting and not just an important effect for certain actors playing certain roles.

In any case, Zamir employs his theory of acting as existential amplification in a fascinating discussion of a range of issues — many more than I can cover in this short review: the aesthetic nuances of acting, the necessity of a theatrical audience, the relation between acting and literature, puppetry, the ethics of acting, pornographic acting, masochism, and anorexia, among others. Of particular interest, to me at least, is his discussion of the ethics of acting both inside and outside of the theater. Much of his discussion is thought-provoking and challenging, and I expect it to generate further discussion.

Given Zamir’s emphasis on acting and imagination, I thought his account might benefit from drawing more on contemporary philosophy of action, moral psychology, and work on pretense and the imagination. I wonder if his theoretical apparatus would be enriched by considering the work of Andy Egan, Peter Goldie, Marya Schechtman, Susanna Schellenberg, or J. David Velleman, to name a few (none of whom are cited). One case in point is Zamir’s note about the parent pretending to be a lion. This is confusing because he spends several pages (33-38) arguing that existential amplification is markedly different from pretense, but those passages seem to employ a concept of pretense that I suspect few philosophers who work on pretense would accept. A closer investigation of pretense, then, might reveal closer links between acting and pretense than Zamir allows.

There is much to admire about Zamir’s book — his deft handling of language familiar to rather different theoretical traditions, his breadth of vision, his combination of philosophical care and theoretical ambition. Zamir’s book achieves something that is rare in philosophy: it’s a good read; it’s daring; it doesn’t bleed with an allegiance to any particular philosophical tradition; it is inspired, creative, and sensitive to actors’ understanding of their art. I’d even go so far as to say that with Acts Zamir has really embodied the role of philosopher and given us a lively performance. I’ll applaud that.