Actual Consciousness

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Ted Honderich, Actual Consciousness, Oxford University Press, 2014, 402pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198714385.

Reviewed by Dale Jacquette, Universität Bern


Ted Honderich's new book takes the exploration of the mysteries of consciousness in an interesting direction. He develops a certain-to-be-controversial metaphysics of actuality defined as event occurrences in an individually subjective but nonetheless physical world. Honderich takes on the difficulties of understanding consciousness by first coming to terms with and clearing the ground of previous efforts to explain consciousness, in order to make room for his own innovations.

He considers five 'Leading Ideas' about the nature of consciousness. They include Qualia, Something It's Like For a Thing To Be That Thing, Subjectivity, Intentionality, Phenomenality (17-50). Honderich first deploys the categories somewhat like an intersecting five-dimensional grid. He uses the framework to situate selected philosophical theories, to sort out what might be worth taking on board, dusted off and in a new suit of clothes, and to distinguish similar approaches from his provocative alternative. The existence and plenitude of these five leading ideas is supposed to testify to the possibility that there might not be a single unified monolithic concept of consciousness, a conclusion Honderich embraces. The word 'consciousness' as a product of the inquiry is provisionally understood collectively, even on the basis of the five leading ideas, to branch into three mutually irreducible kinds of perceptual, affective and cognitive consciousness. Later, when Honderich introduces his preferred theory of actual consciousness, the five ideas are supplanted, suggesting they may have been too crude, by a much longer and more finely nuanced list of thirty-two 'Characteristics of Actual Consciousness: A Database' (67-8). The five 'Leading Ideas' appear merely to get Honderich started, which, like any philosophical inquiry, must get its start somewhere. Honderich's theory of actual consciousness makes perceptual consciousness first and then affective and cognitive consciousness almost as afterthoughts not merely of or about but identified with each thinker's subjective but nonetheless physical lived-in conscious world. The actual subjective physical worlds rather than the objective physical world are what each thinking subject knows in conscious thought, the subjectively experienced physical world in which the individual consciously perceives, feels, thinks, acts and lives.

I admire Honderich's insightful self-reflective re-examination of the facts of consciousness as he perceives them. He takes little for granted as he scouts through the tangled philosophical literature on what is meant in the first place by consciousness as an object of scientific or philosophical study. He has a rich sense of the multiform aspects of consciousness and a resistance to facile generalizations that fail as inadequate to the data when other previously unattended kinds or aspects of consciousness are brought to notice. He can also be difficult to track sometimes as he indulgently allows discussion to drift Tristram Shandy-like into interesting sidelines, and pulls things together with unlikely segues and with too much sudden speed. Honderich is inspirational, even when he does not entirely convince. Even when his conversational prose style as running commentary on the course of his own braiding chains of thought obscures a better understanding of some of the criticisms he raises and exact conclusions he wants to emphasize.

Honderich as mentioned divides consciousness into a triad of perceptual, cognitive and affective consciousnesses. For reasons he does not divulge, he devotes most space in the book to (and in other ways theoretically prioritizes) perceptual over cognitive and affective consciousness. This is curious if contentious. Supposing that there are just these three types of consciousness, that there is never a higher consciousness of simultaneously experiencing moments of perceptual and cognitive or affective consciousness, or the like, why should perceptual consciousness come first? Why not say that cognitive consciousness subsumes perceptual and affective consciousness? If inner perception complements the five outer senses plus proprioception as it does in Aristotle's De anima III.5 and Brentano's 1867 Die Psychologie des Aristoteles, along with all the descriptive psychological and phenomenological tradition deriving from this methodological bloodline of noûs poetikos or innere Wahrnehmung, then affective consciousness might also be subsumed by cognitive consciousness. It could be exploited as a precious resource of inner psychological empirical-experiential data about emotions and other affective occurrences for scientific-philosophical exploration, and first subsumed by perceptual consciousness for those like Aristotle, Brentano, and the widely rippling phenomenological tradition in philosophy of mind.

Honderich's decision to prioritize perceptual over the other two putative types of consciousness is the popular choice, but unexplained for theorists who would not otherwise consider themselves classically empiricist, except as a kind of ingrained epistemic presupposition. Cognition in an obvious sense is the more general category that might reverse at least some of Honderich's hierarchy, subsuming perception as one source of input to the brain's information-hungry cognitive engine. The same point should hold even if statistically as a matter of empirical fact most conscious subjects spend most of their conscious moments perceiving. Significantly, it appears that consciousness is capable also of generic highest-order conscious awareness of these modes of lower-order consciousness. That result if correct further implies that consciousness itself and the concept of consciousness belonging to a respectable philosophical psychology cannot be any individual anarchic or hierarchical combination of the P-A-C or perceptual, affective, cognitive consciousnesses package into which Honderich divides his subject. There are questions about the meaning, advantages and disadvantages of plotting out three kinds of consciousness all on a par as exhausting the concept of especially more encompassing higher-order transcendent consciousness of any sub-order of consciousness that might ever be mentioned. Perceptual + Affective + Cognitive consciousness under any class relations of their respective extensions must not yet get at the nature, essence or general concept of consciousness. If I am not only consciously perceiving a vicious dog straining toward me on its leash, but simultaneously feeling fear and considering my options for action and their probabilities of success if the dog breaks free, then I might be additionally conscious in that moment of consciously perceiving, feeling, and thinking.

Consciousness in that event is not exhaustively divided into Honderich's three types. If there is also consciousness of any of these types of consciousness occurring, then consciousness in the most general sense transcends these specific categories. Honderich's division into types may also be more open-ended than he seems to portray, as long as we can always be conscious of a moment of consciousness of any the kinds in any assigned category as it transpires. To modify Aristotle's De anima argument, if I can be conscious of being perceptually, affectively and cognitively conscious, then there must be consciousness over and above these kinds whenever I am conscious of their lower-level conscious contents.

If unified essentialist universal analyses of the concept of consciousness are simply unavailable, if that Socratic ideal is naïve or passé, then the open-minded reader is owed a more detailed explanation as to why this should be true. It is not because consciousness cannot be comprehended by consciousness. Honderich denies Colin McGinn's mysterianism in philosophy of consciousness, closing down that avenue. He says repeatedly that the concept of consciousness is rationally explicable, that in a sense we must already know what the language about conscious states we are so comfortable using means (350-352 and passim). The argument that there is no unified essentialist universal analysis of the concept of consciousness because there are many opinions about it expressed in the literature does not hold up to logical scrutiny. It is comparable to holding that cold fusion is impossible because no one has succeeded in doing it and there are differing scientific estimates of the prospects of attainment.

Consciousness, streaming moments of consciousness, when we better know analytically what they are, can be mapped readily onto individualizable neurophysiological events. Correlations, mappings in and of themselves, come cheaply enough. The correspondences tendered in modern consciousness studies in contrast are hard-won empirical discoveries resulting from good observation and skillful use of experimental design and scientific instrumentation. It costs nothing for anyone with a horse in the metaphysics-of-consciousness race to agree that mappings of the mental and neurophysiological can be made. The question is what to think about it. What, if anything, does it mean? What does it show?

There are contributors to the philosophical discussion of these questions who believe with surpassing confidence that they know the answers. An observer can only imagine that they are simply oblivious of problems that can easily appear overwhelming when trying to make further sense of the possibility of mapping conscious states as supervening in ontic dependence relations on signature neurophysiological states. For anyone who appreciates the depth and scope of these problems, there is often instead of arrogant presumption a sense of hardly knowing theoretically where to begin. There is an embarrassing accumulated wealth of concepts, distinctions, criteria, theses, proposals, arguments and theories, puzzles, paradoxes and unanswered questions in consciousness studies. Honderich's recent monograph is invaluable even before he gets around to announcing his own theory of actual consciousness by virtue of demonstrating one pathway through the discipline's inherited theoretical thickets.

Honderich departs intriguingly from standard metaphysics of consciousness in his own solution to the sifted problems he thinks any adequate theory of consciousness must adequately address. Beginning with perceptual consciousness in his triune distribution, Honderich presents a novel way of thinking about a passing momentary consciousness of sensory experience. I visually admire a ripe apple before me on the table. I grip and bite into the apple, and I am perceptually conscious of its taste, as I may also be of its color, size, and shape, and surface generally. These experiences of the apple for Honderich do not presuppose a thought-perceptual object relation whereby the actual world is sharply distinguished from its representations in streaming successive moments of consciousness. Rather, Honderich proposes an analysis by which there are multiple actual worlds, all of them physical. Actuality is in particular each thinking subject's subjective physical world. The subjective physical worlds in which each of us lives are like separate apartments to which no one else is admitted. If Honderich is right, then they are also exactly so many actualities.

I am not sure that I fully grasp Honderich's distinction between objective and subjective physical reallity that is key to understanding his new theory of consciousness. The concept is presented in Chapters 7 and 8, the title and subtitle of Chapter 8 reads: 'Perceptual Consciousness -- Being Actual Is Being Subjectively Physical. The category of the subjectively physical.' Honderich explains in a subsection of Chapter 8, 'Subjective Physical Worlds -- Their Subjectivity':

Subjective physical worlds are not separate from consciousness. We have no reason to think, although we have not yet considered cognitive and affective consciousness, that they do not stand in lawful or dependency relations with it. Also subjective physical worlds are identical with and include facts of consciousness. As you will guess, we are here at part of the centre or gravamen of the actualism theory of consciousness. Perceptual consciousness, already characterized as physical, is also in the given way or sense subjective.

Subjective physical worlds, further, unlike the objective physical world, are almost always a matter of the consciousness of one particular individual perceiver. (227)

To the extent that I understand the concept, each of us lives, functions or operates within his or her own subjective physical world. There is, apparently for decorum's sake, one objective physical world, but then as many subjective physical worlds as there are perceiving subjects, each of which along with the subjective moments of consciousness it contains is actual. Subjective physical worlds are not mere tablet-stylus imagistic representations of the objective physical world in causal partial sync with its ongoing events, but physical worlds themselves in their own ontic-metaphysical right. They are for each of us the physical world of perception-plus affect and cognition (hence the subjectivity) and action (hence the actuality). The exact ontology of this remarkable relation is mentioned but not further explained by Honderich, as though in light of criticisms of other theories of consciousness it were the only or best explanation. Which it could be, although I did not see the argument for that proposition in Honderich's book.

Honderich does not spell out an exact inference, with all its assumptions basking in the sun, that would allow us to pocket the superiority of positing a single objective and multiple subjective physical worlds ontology in order to explain the nature of perceptual consciousness. Actual consciousness as the physical world of each subject's subjective individual consciousness is not a mere approximate representation of an external mind-independent objective physical world. It is a world in and of itself, containing the subjective presentations of dynamic things in which we live and of which we are conscious or of which at least our perceptual consciousness consists, and with which in that space we interact with other things, including socially with other persons. It remains unclear to me in particular despite my desire to be sympathetic what would justify postulating a singleton objective world and plethora of subjective physical worlds. Why could Honderich not make all the same essential points by holding that there is one physical world that presents as many aspects of itself subjectively as there are different perceiving subjects? How is understanding of consciousness gained by speaking of distinct worlds? Is it to powerfully emphasize the subjectivity of consciousness and interimpenetrability of the conscious states of different conscious subjects? It is not clear that we must resort to worlds for that modest conclusion. There is a theoretical downside also to accepting multiple subjective physical worlds in the metaphysics of consciousness. What is actual for one subject is not the actual subjective physical world of any other subject. If actuality is as Honderich maintains being subjectively physical, how is it possible for science to address itself methodologically to a common actuality, a common actual physical world? The objective physical world exists for Honderich almost in neo-Kantian P.F. Strawsonian style, independently of actual existence, and identified instead with an immense succession of distinct subjective physical worlds. The nagging problem here, I suspect, is working out the relation between the objective physical world and the actualities of all conscious subjects living in their respective subjective physical worlds.

If a subjective physical world is the world that each of us inhabits, where our cares and intentions are located, why suppose that there is besides these also an objective physical world? Certainly we have no direct perceptual access to it. Perception takes us no further than subjective physical actuality. For this reason we cannot compare the contents of moments of conscious perception with an external reality as its mental representations. We are not thinking of affective consciousness, leaving in Honderich's category scheme only cognitive consciousness. For a philosopher to be conscious that there is an objective physical world in addition to the philosopher's occupied subjective physical world requires accepting an abstract argument to that effect. Would it not be excluded on these grounds by Ockham's Razor? Kantian noumenal reality, even of a Strawson-inspired kind, does not offer contemporary empirical science objectivity in the sense it needs and expects. Appealing to multiple subjective physical worlds, multiple actualities, rather than a mind-independent singleton actual world, is unlikely to be greeted by many theorists as doing the natural sciences much of a metaphysical or epistemological favor. One suspects that Honderich's metaphysics faces an uphill climb to find favor with rigorously experimental neurophysiogical and psychological science.

Honderich rightly emphasizes the intentionality of representation. He finds the intentionality of consciousness more developed philosophically than discussions of qualia. He staunchly disappoints the recent wave of so-called representational theories of consciousness that try to offer unexplicated representation as an alternative to theories emphasizing the intentionality or aboutness of conscious thoughts. Abstract one-one mappings of things and their parts can always be supposed to exist, but, lacking an intrinsic intentionality by which this object in the mapping network symbolizes its corresponding object, they are not yet representations of anything.

That Honderich's discussion of actual consciousness opens so many avenues for philosophical exploration is the measure of its success and likely long-lasting contribution to the study and understanding of consciousness. The book is highly recommended for its topic, approach and new perspectives on the challenging problem of adequately understanding consciousness in a scientific philosophy of mind. For those with minimal objection to countenancing as many actualities (subjective physical worlds, Honderich does not hesitate to say) as there are perceiving minds, then the subjective actuality of consciousness may have found an ideal situation in Honderich's theory of actual consciousness.