Actual Ethics

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James R. Otteson, Actual Ethics, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 349pp., $25.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521681251.

Reviewed by Blain Neufeld, University of Dublin, Trinity College


The aim of James R. Otteson's Actual Ethics is to articulate and defend 'classical liberalism' as a philosophical doctrine capable of addressing questions concerning politics, ethics, and the good life.  According to Otteson, classical liberalism is "founded on principles that almost everyone endorses, implicitly if not explicitly, in everyday life" (ix).  Yet these principles have a radical political implication: only a 'minimal' state -- one restricted to protecting people's lives, 'negative' liberties, and private property -- is just.

The book is divided into three parts.  The first part, entitled 'Working Out The Position,' consists of five chapters.  In chapter one Otteson formulates the basic normative principles of his account of classical liberalism.  At its foundation is a commitment to the Kantian principle of 'respect for personhood.'  'Persons,' in contrast to 'things,' are autonomous rational agents, and thus "may not be used against their will to serve other people's ends" (5).  Furthermore, persons have a capacity for 'judgement,' that is, an ability to form, critically revise, and pursue their ends (goals, projects, conceptions of the good, etc.).  Freedom is needed in order for persons to exercise judgement, and persons can improve their capacity for judgement over time only by being held responsible for the consequences of their exercise of it.  Otteson refers to this connection between judgement and responsibility as "natural necessity" (16).  Thus, by having the freedom to engage in Millian 'experiments in living,' the workings of natural necessity will lead to the development of judgement in persons, and a corresponding recognition by them of what their good, and thus happiness, consists in.  A distinction is then drawn by Otteson between "positive virtue" and "negative justice": the former requires 'positive' actions whereas the latter requires only refraining from certain actions (22-24).  Only negative justice -- which consists of "protection of oneself, protections of one's liberty, and protections of one's property" (26) -- can legitimately be enforced by the coercive power of the state.  This leads to Otteson's version of Mill's 'harm principle,' which he calls the "General Liberty principle," according to which people should be free to do whatever they want, so long as they do not cause "positive harm" (violations of negative justice) to others (36-40).  While we should criticize people who are 'vicious' or fail to exercise adequate positive virtue, insofar as they do not cause positive harm, we cannot justly coercively interfere with them.

The second and third chapters draw out the political implications of Otteson's understanding of these principles.  He argues that only a minimal state, one charged solely with enforcing negative justice, is compatible with respecting people's personhood.  In contrast, both socialist states and (to a lesser extent) welfare states treat people as things, not persons, because they override the ability of people to exercise freely their capacity for judgement (in deciding how to live, how to use their property, etc.).  This is inevitable, as centralized states lack the necessary 'local knowledge' to know what is best for different people.  Otteson also defends the distinction between "negative liberty" and "positive liberty," maintaining that the former is "compossible" (realizable by everyone) whereas the latter is not, and that when a state endeavours to promote positive liberty, it invariably fails to respect the personhood and negative liberty of (at least some of) its citizens.  This, he claims, is the "contradiction" at the heart of the welfare state (74).  Finally, Otteson distinguishes between "political power" and "social power": the latter consists of "the power of individuals voluntarily working together" (113).  People concerned with pursuing goals associated with positive virtue, such as helping the poor, should employ social power, since employing political power invariably involves violations of negative justice (i.e. positive harm).

Chapter four attempts to refute Peter Singer's utilitarian argument that members of wealthy western societies have a moral obligation to transfer much of their wealth to the world's poor.  Chapter five is a broad empirical investigation into what institutions and policies actually contribute to overall human flourishing, understood in terms of material wealth.  Unsurprisingly, those countries whose institutions and policies most closely resemble those of the minimal state rank best.  Thus the minimal state, in addition to respecting people's personhood, also turns out to best promote overall wealth.

Part Two, entitled 'Applying the Principles,' consists of three chapters.  Chapter six concerns education.  Otteson recommends the complete abolishment of all state supported education.  In chapter seven he discusses topics such as sexual harassment and discrimination in hiring.  Since Otteson thinks that both sexual harassment and discrimination are cases of viciousness, not injustice, he concludes that the state should not use political power to interfere with such practices (individuals, of course, are free to use social power to address them).  Finally, in chapter eight, Otteson addresses the rights of homosexuals and animals.  He maintains that homosexual practices should be permitted and that homosexuals should be allowed to marry.  However, Otteson also (tentatively) recommends against allowing homosexuals to adopt children.  As for animals, they are things and not persons, thus we may use them for our own ends, such as food and medical research.  However, abusing animals is vicious and should be discouraged, and requiring people to own the animals they use is an effective way to do this, since people tend not to waste their own property.

Part Three has only one chapter, which addresses goodness and happiness.  Otteson notes that his discussion throughout the book assumes that "happiness is everyone's ultimate goal" (319), and argues that "a person's happiness is ultimately constituted by his having successfully promoted his interests or good" (328).  Respecting the General Liberty principle gives people the latitude necessary for exercising and developing their capacity for judgement, and thereby ascertaining what their interests and good consist in.  Finally, while loving relationships are important for most people's happiness, the human capacity for genuine concern for others is limited, and so 'moral cosmopolitanism' -- which, according to Otteson, requires deep genuine concern for all of humanity -- is impossible, and indeed counterproductive.  Instead, we can be obligated only to observe negative justice towards the rest of humanity.

As my summary indicates, the scope of this book is impressive.  Otteson is careful to note, however, that he does not attempt to present all of the relevant positions concerning every issue he discusses.  Instead, he aims at providing only a 'primer' or introduction to classical liberalism, one that can easily be understood by non-academic readers (xv-xvi, 337).  Consequently, he accepts "the risk of leaving some professional academics ultimately unsatisfied" (xviii).  Given the range of issues and arguments covered by Otteson, this risk is a sure thing.  No doubt readers of the summary above have already identified numerous contentious claims.  They should not expect a comprehensive discussion of them in the book.

Even granting that Actual Ethics is intended mainly as a 'primer,' though, Otteson's political arguments based on the principle of respect for personhood fail to consider the most obvious and important alternative position to his own, one that also claims to be based on that principle.  Specifically, he ignores the 'liberal egalitarian' position in contemporary political philosophy, most prominently represented in recent decades by John Rawls's theory of 'justice as fairness.'[1]  Very roughly, according to liberal egalitarians like Rawls, equal respect for the personhood of all citizens means that the coercive institutions that govern citizens' common life -- the main political, legal, and economic institutions of society -- should be organized in accordance with principles of justice that adequately realize the idea of society as a fair system of cooperation over time among free and equal persons.  Consequently, the main political and economic institutions of a just society must secure and maintain the political equality of all citizens, and this, in turn, requires that all citizens have sufficient resources to avoid being in relations of dependency vis-à-vis other citizens.[2]

To see why Otteson should have considered the liberal egalitarian interpretation of the principle of respect for personhood, let us look at his account of property.  Otteson's classical liberalism, unlike, say, Robert Nozick's libertarianism,[3] does not presuppose the existence of "natural rights" (278-279), including a natural right to property.  Instead, respect for private property is derivative of respect for personhood: we violate people's personhood -- we treat them as things, not persons -- when we use their property for purposes to which they do not freely consent.  This is the main reason why the welfare state violates people's personhood, according to Otteson.  But this leaves unanswered the fundamental question: what is a person's right to property?

Interestingly, the specification of property rights is, according to Otteson, one of the core functions of the state:

To protect … [people's] personhood, the state will have to have … an agency to make public rules about what counts as property, what counts as transfer, what constitutes ownership, what the punishments are for violation, and so on. (106)

This is a significant concession.  Recall that, for Otteson, justice requires the coercive protection of a person's life, liberty, and property.  However, if what constitutes 'property' itself is to be determined by the state, then it simply cannot be assumed that a 'right to property' precludes taxation for purposes beyond the maintenance of the minimal state, including distributive purposes (say, to ensure that all citizens have the minimal resources necessary for them to meaningfully exercise their capacity for judgement with respect to their own lives, and to avoid circumstances of dependency on others).  If a democratic state decides that the public rules concerning property are to be understood in this way, then Otteson's claim that most taxation is akin to "forced labour" (62-63) is a non-starter, as a person's right to property would simply be defined as a right legitimately subject to such taxation.

In connection to this matter, it is worth looking at Otteson's criticism of Samuel Fleischacker's argument that the state should provide citizens with the resources necessary for them to exercise meaningful judgement in their lives (68-74).[4]  Against Fleischacker, Otteson argues that the welfare state violates people's personhood because it coercively takes away the property of some people to provide services and goods to others.  But if property rights are defined by a democratic state in such a way as to permit taxation, and if the rules concerning property rights and taxation are public -- as they assuredly would be in an adequately just liberal society -- then there is no obvious interference with the ability of people to exercise judgement in planning their lives, pursuing their conceptions of the good, etc.  This is because they can form rational expectations about their future resources, and plan accordingly, based on their knowledge of the public rules concerning property and taxation.

In response to this challenge from liberal egalitarianism, Otteson could perhaps make a pragmatic appeal to the relative economic success of countries that cleave more closely to classical liberal notions of property than those that do not.  However, this hardly decides the question.  Empirical facts about the importance of markets for economic success are certainly serious considerations that citizens in a democratic society should take into account in their determination of the public rules concerning property.  But they are considerations to be weighed against others.  Chief among the counter-balancing considerations is the concern that citizens have, according to liberal egalitarians, to ensure that the political and economic institutions of their society maintain relations of overall political equality.  This is a fundamental part the liberal egalitarian understanding of the principle of respect for personhood.  The classical liberal society that Otteson advocates simply would not be able to ensure such political equality, as it would render disadvantaged citizens dependent on assistance -- of widely varying quality and availability -- provided through 'social power' by private associations.  Such dependency on private associations is incompatible with political equality, at least according to liberal egalitarians.

Although liberal egalitarians are often critical of existing welfare states,[5] they clearly interpret the principle of equal respect for personhood to have, as one of its primary consequences, an account of property rights that permits principles of distributive justice.  Given that Otteson recognizes that the institution of property is a social one, determined ultimately by political authority, he cannot simply assume that the classical liberal account of property rights is the only one on the table.  However, by not engaging the liberal egalitarian alternative, his advocacy of the classical liberal account of property is far less convincing than it otherwise would be.

There are other gaps in Otteson's case for classical liberalism, but I will limit myself to a few concluding comments on his discussion of education.  In his argument that all government-provided education should be abolished, Otteson gives short shrift to the possibility that -- because children are future persons, with interests separate from those of their parents -- a just liberal society should ensure that all children receive an education sufficient for their future exercise of judgement, irrespective of the desires of their parents.  Based on Otteson's own recommendation, though, parents should be free to send their children to schools that deny them the opportunity to develop their capacity for judgement (say, by being taught to conform uncritically to a single way of life) or that educate them to disrespect the personhood of other citizens (say, by being taught that certain other citizens are inferior on the basis of race, gender, or religion).  It is impossible to see how such illiberal and future-undermining possibilities could be prevented if the state were to withdraw completely from education.  (Otteson's failure to consider children's interests qua independent future persons is especially striking, given that it is precisely such interests that prompt him to recommend against allowing homosexual couples to adopt children.)

Otteson also fails to distinguish between government administration of education and government subsidization of education.  Most of Otteson's 'empirical' complaints against the American public educational system seem to concern the former -- indeed, he ignores entirely alternative forms of public education provision, such as those advanced by advocates of 'school choice' reforms today in the United States and elsewhere.[6]  Furthermore, his criticism of the quality of public education seems rather parochial, as it fails to consider why the educational systems of many other countries apparently fare better than the American system.[7]  In short, even if one agreed with Otteson that the current American public educational system is failing students, and is overly 'ideological' in terms of curriculum content, his failure to consider obvious policy alternatives, as well as the experiences of other countries, weakens the plausibility of his own rather extreme recommendation.

There are many other contentious claims made in this book.  However, as already mentioned, Otteson intends this book primarily for the general reader, not other professional academics.  Taken as such, it is easy to understand, devoid of unnecessary philosophical jargon, and eminently readable (although with a definite American focus).  As a primer that clearly outlines the main elements of the classical liberal position, Actual Ethics is successful, even if it is likely to be persuasive only to the already converted.

[1] J. Rawls, A Theory of Justice, Revised Edition (Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1999).

[2] For discussion of this point, see: E. Anderson, "What is the Point of Equality?" Ethics 109 (1999), 287-337.

[3] R. Nozick, Anarchy, State, and Utopia (New York: Basic Books, 1974).

[4] S. Fleischacker, A Third Concept of Liberty: Judgement and Freedom in Kant and Adam Smith (Princeton, N.J.: Princeton University Press, 1999).

[5] E.g., see Rawls, A Theory of Justice, pp. xiv-xv.

[6] For a recent discussion of possible 'choice' policies, see: P.T. Hill (ed.) Choice with Equity (Stanford: Hoover University Press, 2002).

[7] On page 219, Otteson cites a survey in which American students fare very poorly in comparison to others, but fails to note that the other countries in the survey also have government-supported educational systems.