Actuality, Possibility, and Worlds

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Alexander R. Pruss, Actuality, Possibility, and Worlds, Continuum, 2011, 303pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441142047.

Reviewed by Eric Hiddleston, Wayne State University


Alexander R. Pruss's Actuality, Possibility, and Worlds defends an "Aristotelian-Leibnizian" account of metaphysical modality. The Aristotelian component of the view holds that modal truths must be "grounded" in causal capabilities of actually existing substances; Pruss proposes that the capabilities of God are especially well-suited to play this role. The Leibnizian side holds that possible worlds are ideas in the mind of God. After some initial stage setting (Parts I and II), the bulk of Pruss's book first raises difficulties for alternative views of modality (Parts III and IV) and then presents his favored account (Parts V and esp. VI). I will explain Pruss's view and his general argument for that view first, and then consider his objections to other views, with an eye toward seeing whether Pruss's view really improves upon those alternatives.

Pruss sets up the issue by claiming that an adequate account of metaphysical modality must solve two problems. First is the "grounding" problem: "What ontological features of reality make the right modal assertion be true?" (5). In at least some cases, these grounds should be "truthmakers" for the modal facts (though Pruss allows that the absence of a falsemaker can also serve as a ground, 21). Second is the "worlds" problem: what are possible worlds?

Pruss's main motivation is the thought that only an Aristotelian account of modality is capable of solving the grounding problem. He introduces this account with an example of a sculptor and some bronze. The metaphysical possibility of there being a bronze statue is grounded in the "actual capabilities" of the sculptor and the bronze (212). These capabilities are "actual and concrete in a paradigmatic way", but are also "through-and-through modal" (212). Pruss extends this idea to an account of modal truthmakers which he summarizes: "a non-actual state of affairs is made possible by something capable of initiating a chain of causes leading up to that state of affairs" (213).

On this Aristotelian account, all metaphysical possibilities must branch off causally from the actual world at some point. There is an apparent problem for this view, however. It seems plausible that there are "alien" possibilities which differ from actuality at all times. Perhaps these include physically possible universes with nonactual initial conditions, universes with entirely different fundamental properties, or worlds with 22 spacetime dimensions. Pruss accepts that such things are metaphysically possible (216). His solution is to hold that there is a necessary being, God, who has the capability of bringing about these alien possibilities: "He can produce a 22-dimensional universe, not just think about one" (216). So, the alien possibilities too can be grounded in causal capabilities of actual substances.

Pruss's solution to the "worlds" problem is the Leibnizian component of his view: possible worlds are ideas in the mind of God. Pruss introduces this Leibnizian component by considering and seeming to endorse Leibniz's claim that a necessary truth requires a divine mind to entertain it (205-6). Necessary propositions are not mere "thinkables" which exist independently of thought; instead they are "divine thinkings" (206). It is natural then to define a possible world as "a maximal coherent divine idea" (208). So far we need divine minds to think necessary propositions. Could there be multiple such minds, or different ones in different worlds? Pruss argues that there should be a single divine mind that thinks all of the necessary propositions (207-8). And this extends across worlds too: "By Ockham's razor, it is simpler to suppose that the same mind contains all the necessary truths in every world" (208). And simplicity again recommends extending this view from the necessary propositions to propositions generally (209-10). Pruss suggests that this view of propositions also solves the problem, raised by Lewis, of how propositions could "represent". They represent by "divine intentionality" (210). Though it may be difficult "to say how the thinkings of a person represent the world, it would be self-defeating to doubt that they can do it" (211).

Pruss argues from the Aristotelian account of modality to the existence of a necessary being (217-8). He suggests a version of the Principle of Sufficient Reason (PSR), that "every contingently true proposition has a causal explanation" (218). Understanding explanation in terms of causal capabilities, Pruss then argues that this PSR is equivalent to the Aristotelian account of modality (218-20, 228-30). Pruss also describes a number of "implications" concerning dispositions, essences, powers, explanation, and related matters (235-54).

Some elements on the Leibnizian side of Pruss's view would probably strike many contemporary metaphysicians as overly speculative. The Aristotelian side of Pruss's view seems to be the primary one, however, and I would guess that he could get most of what he really cares about even without the claim, for example, that propositions are God's thinkings. Still, the Aristotelian view will attract criticism on many fronts.

Humeans about modality will hold that Pruss's attempt to ground metaphysical modalities in causal capabilities merely pushes the question back one step: what actual world facts could ground facts about these capabilities? Pruss's Part II section 2 argues against Humean views. Lewis does not give a satisfactory account of the direction of time in terms of counterfactuals, Pruss argues (42-7); taking the direction of time as primitive is a "last resort" (49); and neither the increase of entropy (49-51) nor the openness of the future (51-2) provide fully satisfactory accounts either. The only account left standing is that the direction of time "derives from the predominant direction of causation" (47). So, this view is right, and causation does not reduce to nonmodal facts. That is a plausible enough view, but Pruss's arguments here are exceedingly brief given the magnitude of his conclusion. Humeans could rightly complain that Pruss has not done enough to support his Aristotelian view over their own approach.

Another more general worry about Pruss's Aristotelian view is available to metaphysicians of all stripes. The Aristotelian picture of branching possibilities is certainly attractive. This sort of structure plays a role in our deliberations, for example. So, there is a strong motivation for an account of modality to recognize some such branching structures. But it is a further generalization of this idea, which would seem to require further justification, to hold that absolutely all possibilities fit into a single such structure. In addition, that generalized view seems to be subject to the worry about alien possibilities. One can make this picture consistent by adding God to it as Pruss does; but one could equally well take alien possibilities to justify a rejection of the fully generalized Aristotelian picture. My impression is that most metaphysicians at present would reject the generalized Aristotelian view for exactly this reason. To argue for theism by taking the generalized Aristotelian view of modality as a basic premise seems unlikely to sway many people at present.

Pruss's Part III argues against David Lewis's "Extreme Modal Realism" (EMR). His two main objections (25-6 singles these out) are that EMR conflicts with ordinary ethical judgments (section 8) and leads to inductive skepticism (section 9). Part IV argues against "Linguistic" and "Platonist" accounts. Pruss worries that Platonism does not provide an answer to the "grounding" problem. His main positive objection is based on a thought-experiment: "Imagine, per impossible according to the Platonist, that all and only the entities from the Platonic heaven disappeared" (165). Would this make actually true propositions impossible by virtue of the disappearance of the truthmakers for their possibility? Clearly not, Pruss claims (166). He also suggests an experiment of the opposite sort: suppose it added to heaven that necessarily there are no dogs. "But any such change notwithstanding," Pruss objects, "dogs will remain possible" (167).

Pruss considers and rejects the view that no grounding for modal truths is needed (172-6). In the course of doing this, he rejects what I think the Platonist should say. There are proposed facts (Big-P) that proposition p has primitive Platonic property P, and (Little-P) that p is possible. The Platonist should say that (Little-P) = (Big-P), that these are the same facts, and that P = the property of being possible. The ground for (Little-P) = (Big-P) = itself. These Platonic entities actually exist, so they are actual facts which serve as "grounds" for modal truths. This view might be unsatisfying for other reasons, but treating something as its own ground seems more or less just what it is to take that thing as primitive.

So, Platonism appears to have some sort of answer to the grounding problem. This answer is not satisfying to Pruss, but it is somewhat difficult to see just what his main worry is. For example, Pruss insists that (Little-P) needs more grounding than (Big-P), and he presents a trilemma for the view that it doesn't (173). One horn of the trilemma is that (Big-P) and (Little-P) "come to the same thing" (173). Pruss objects, "one can believe [(Little-P)] without believing that there are any Platonic entities"; he continues that on this view "the opponent of the Platonist is horribly confused: she does not understand everyday modal propositions" (173). This argument seems unconvincing. One could equally object to Pruss that people who reject his Leibnizian account "do not understand everyday modal propositions". Obviously there are difficult issues here about the nature and objects of belief, but these problems appear to affect all parties to the current dispute equally.

What is probably the main worry for Pruss's view, however, seems to arise from Euthyphro-style questions. We have an antecedent grasp of a concept of possibility. Let's call the thing we have a grasp of "real possibility", while attempting to remain neutral about its nature. Pruss accepts this Euthyphro-style claim:

(1) p is really possible iff p is creatable-by-God.

Pruss does not offer any direct justification for (1). His argument is the indirect one that alternative views of modality are subject to difficulties and that only (1) can provide adequate "grounding" for real possibility. The Platonist does have some sort of grounding, however, in her primitive Platonic properties. She would surely say that the order of conceptual priority goes from real possibility to createability-by-God. She could ask these Euthyphro-style questions:

(E1) Why should God be incapable of bringing about really impossible propositions, such as contradictory ones?

(E2) Why should God be capable of bringing about really possible propositions?

As far as I could see, Pruss does not address issue (E1). He seems to think it obvious that God lacks the capability to bring about contradictory propositions. I could not see what Pruss thinks the basis for this limitation is, however. Obviously God cannot bring about something which is "impossible" in the sense that God cannot bring it about; but what does that have to do with real possibility and contradictory propositions as intuitively judged? Maybe the inability to bring about contradictory propositions is no limitation on God's power because contradictory propositions are really impossible. That response, however, appeals to a prior concept of real possibility. The response appears to be: God cannot create contradictory propositions because they are really impossible and the Euthyphro claim (1) is true.

Question (E2) is whether there might be further limitations of God's capabilities, beyond real possibility. Maybe God is a dog-lover. He loves dogs so much that He would never create a world that did not contain cute little puppies at some point in time. Would this make it necessary that dogs exist? Seemingly not. As with the question (E1), one is likely to respond that God's nature is not as this objection imagines (and could not be). But in that case it seems that the account so far has not yet answered the original question of what makes it really possible that there are no dogs. The reason God can create worlds without dogs seems to be: it is really possible that there are no dogs, and the Euthyphro claim (1) is true.

Related worries apply to logical principles in Pruss's account. He argues that his view validates S5 (218-20); his overall argument relies on the following brief argument for the weaker S4 principle. Suppose that it is possible that it is possible that p; then on the Aristotelian account there is an x such that:

x can initiate a chain that can lead to there being an item, say y, that can initiate a chain that can lead to its being the case that p. Putting these two potential chains together we see that x can initiate a chain that can lead to p's holding. In other words, ◊◊p ⊃ ◊p . . . . (218)

This argument seems to rest on temporal considerations, however, and it is at least not obvious to me how it applies to the case of God's own, atemporal states. Maybe God loves dogs so much he wouldn't create a world without them; but maybe he doesn't love his own love of dogs quite so much. Maybe starting from this world, God couldn't create a world without dogs, while he could create a world with dogs in which his love of dogs is diminished to the point that he could create a world without them. If that was so, then createability-by-God would not respect S4 (it is necessary that there are dogs, but not necessary that it is necessary). It may well be that something about God's nature rules out this option, but the point is that whether S4 holds on Pruss's account depends upon these theological matters. This is another example of the Euthyphro worry: Pruss seems willing to take principles that seem intuitively right for real and/or or causal possibility to reveal facts about createability-by-God. That is an extra step, however.

Pruss considers two objections in the vicinity of the Euthyphro problem. One holds that his view makes it trivial that God is omnipotent (267); the other holds that his view gets the order of explanation backwards by explaining possibilities in terms of capabilities, leading to "vicious circularity" (269). In responding to the triviality objection, Pruss says:

even if the claim that God is omnipotent is tautologous on the theory, the claim that God is omnipotent is still contentful. For we have independent epistemic access to what is logically possible . . . so saying that the metaphysically possible is . . . the same as the possible-for-God does convey some information to us. (267)

We have "defeasible intuitive reason to believe" various claims about possibility, Pruss continues (267), which then lead to informative claims about God's capabilities.

The main objection here, I think, does not immediately concern circularity, triviality, or question-begging; it is instead that to appeal to the Euthyphro claim to justify claims about createability-by-God is to rely on a prior and unanalyzed concept of real possibility.

To illustrate this worry, it might be useful to consider an analogy with a Platonist and a Leibniz-inspired view about sets and the relation of set-membership, ∈. The Platonist view takes 'ab' as a conceptual primitive, not defined explicitly, but spelled out implicitly by the axioms of set-theory. '∈' expresses some relation in Platonic heaven, the Platonist says, which has the features given by the axioms. An alternative Leibnizian view might hold that there is a relation a is considered among b by God. The Leibnizian might suggest that this relation, itself primitive, can replace the Platonist's primitive. There are two main ways for this Leibnizian to proceed. On the one hand, he could claim that it is an analytic conceptual truth that 'ab' means the same as 'a is considered among b by God'. Such a claim is implausible in this case, however. The other way to proceed is to hold that being considered among by God fills the conceptual role of set-membership. To justify this sort of account, the Leibnizian would have to argue that his relation has the important features of ∈.

To take a more concrete example, consider this version of the "pairing" axiom for set membership:

(2) If a and b exist, then there is a "pair set" c such that ac, bc, and nothing else is a member of c.

(2) is partially definitive of '∈', according to the Platonist. As such, she does not have to provide much substantive argument that the membership relation satisfies (2), if it exists in the first place. (The worry for her view is instead that this relation may not exist.) By contrast, the Leibnizian who wants to replace ∈ with the relation considered among by God has to argue that his relation is a suitable replacement, and in particular that it satisfies the pairing axiom, in this version:

(3) If a and b exist, then there is a c such that a is considered among c by God, b is considered among c by God, and nothing else is considered among c by God.

How could one argue for (3)? A bad way to proceed is to take this as a basic assumption:

(4) ab iff a is considered among b by God.

(4) is the analog of the Euthyphro claim (1) for this case. Assuming (4), (3) follows from (2): the Leibnizian relation satisfies the pairing axiom because the Platonist one does, and the two are linked by the "Euthyphro" claim. But this justification for (3) serves no good end because it does nothing to eliminate the original Platonic primitive '∈'. Instead, we now have not one but two conceptual primitives, linked by a further basic postulate, (4). And the upshot of all of this is a system that accomplishes exactly the same logical and conceptual work that the Platonist's system was able to accomplish without the Leibnizian addition. So, this view is actually worse than the Platonist's view.

A similar worry threatens Pruss's account of modality. It seems reasonably clear that we cannot run a narrowly conceptual analysis of real possibility in terms of createability-by-God. When we ask why God is incapable of creating situations in which contradictions are true, the only apparent answer is that such situations are really impossible. So, it seems that Pruss's account would have to be a role-playing one. But we also seem to lack any reason to think that createability-by-God can play the conceptual role of real possibility. To justify that it does play this role by taking the Euthyphro claim as a basic postulate, as Pruss seems to do, makes his overall account depend upon the prior concept of real possibility. The Euthyphro claim's left-hand side introduces 'real possibility' as an unanalyzed term, and this term functions to explain the right-hand side, concerning Pruss's further primitive property createability-by-God. So, it seems that Pruss's view really has (or needs) two primitives: real possibility and createability-by-God. With real possibility as a primitive, however, createability-by-God could seemingly be set aside in the account of modality.

Pruss could potentially avoid this "two primitives" worry by going externalist. He could hold that 'possibility' is a conceptual primitive, while the metaphysical feature that this primitive tracks is in fact createability-by-God. Some of Pruss's remarks at least suggest such a view. For example, at one point Pruss compares our grasp of 'causal power' to our grasp of 'water', and suggests that we can grasp God's powers through that grasp together with a reference-fixing description for 'God' such as 'The First Cause of of all contingent beings' (254-5). In addition, at one point Pruss mentions sympathetically an "illuminationist epistemology" on which "the ground of the necessity of p can motivate God to cause us to think that p is necessary" (252). Such an externalist account owes us some justification for the proposed matching between our primitive concept and God's capabilities, however. The "illuminationist" view might appeal to God's goodness: God gave us this conceptual primitive, and He would not allow us to be deceived, so He ensured that our primitive concept matched His capabilities. So, due to God's goodness, we can take our intuitive grasp of real possibility to reveal God's capabilities.

This externalist view does not need any metaphysically primitive property of real possibility (distinct from createability-by-God, at least), and so would nicely serve Pruss's purposes. Pruss does not explicitly endorse this view, however; in addition, it must be admitted that the view rests on some fairly speculative theological claims. Instead, the general impression that one receives from Pruss's book is that he thinks that no direct justification for the Euthyphro claim (1) is needed. He seems to assume throughout his discussion that the intuitively grasped real possibilities match God's capabilities. It seems to me that some further justification for that claim is needed. The externalist justification is speculative, and the only apparent internalist justification amounts to taking the concept of real possibility as an unexplained primitive.