Adam Smith and the Character of Virtue

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Ryan Patrick Hanley, Adam Smith and the Character of Virtue, Cambridge UP, 2009, 224 pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521449298.

Reviewed by Sam Fleischacker, University of Illinois-Chicago



In March, 1788, Adam Smith told his publisher that he was preparing a new edition of his Theory of Moral Sentiments (TMS), which would include significant revisions to his account of duty, and of the history of philosophy. A year later Smith wrote his publisher again, with an apology for taking so long about his revisions and an excuse: he had decided to add, not just the revisions mentioned in 1788, but “a compleat new sixth part containing a practical system of Morality, under the title of the Character of Virtue.” Smith expressed embarrassment about the delay caused by the writing of the new sixth part, but explained that “the subject ha[d] grown upon [him].”1

From this letter, the only evidence we have of what Smith thought he was doing in the new sixth part of TMS, it looks as if he expected it to enhance the book, but not that it was supposed to mark any major shift in, or supplement to, his philosophical views. Nor have readers generally seen Part VI of the final edition of TMS as particularly startling, deep, or brilliant. It contains appealing, eloquent descriptions of various types of personalities — the prudent man, the vain man, the “man of system” — and scholars often quote certain passages in it as good sources for Smith’s view of the circles of benevolence, the importance of self-command, or the dangers of trying radically to re-shape societies. But on the whole, Part VI has been regarded as more homily than philosophy, containing little if anything that adds to the innovative accounts of sympathy, moral and aesthetic judgment, economic motivation, and the nature of the self to be found in the earlier parts of TMS.

Ryan Hanley offers a powerful challenge to this scholarly consensus. In his new book, Adam Smith and the Character of Virtue, Hanley argues that the “practical system of Morality” in TMS VI amounts to no less than Smith’s considered answer to the question of how classical and Christian virtues can be accommodated in modern, liberal society. Hanley’s argument, to this reviewer’s surprise and wonder at least — having worked on Smith for the past 20 years, I have always shared the general scholarly condescension towards TMS VI — is remarkably convincing. If he does not fully convince skeptics that Smith meant to answer one of the most important problems he faced in the late additions to TMS, Hanley certainly makes a case for the importance of Part VI that all future Smith scholars will have to heed.

A word, first, on the problem that Part VI, according to Hanley, is meant to address. It has long been argued, by thinkers as different as Daniel Bell and Leo Strauss, Michael Sandel and Alasdair MacIntyre, that our modern political and socio-economic world — the world of capitalism (“commerce”, for Smith) and liberal democracy — leads to a sharp diminution in the attention people pay to virtue, that it breeds instead a shallow selfishness in which people care more about accumulating material goods than achieving either the courage and wisdom praised by Plato and Aristotle, or the transformation of the soul urged by Christianity and other religions. For some of these critics, the lid came off Pandora’s box as soon as Bacon, Descartes, and Hobbes developed a mechanistic and non-theistic science to replace the teleological outlook of the pre-modern world; for others, the atomistic individualism fostered by capitalism and liberal democracy makes it difficult to take seriously the sense of community central to ancient Greek and medieval Christian moralities; for still others, the main problem lies in a leveling of human horizons that comes with the great emphasis on equality in modern society. But all these critics agree that Smith is a prime representative of everything they oppose: of mechanistic science, atomic individualism, and the loss of noble aspirations. Defenders of Smith have tended to concede that Smith represents these things, while arguing that he rightly sees the new world of the Enlightenment as having benefits that outweigh the harm it does to the traditional virtues. Charles Griswold’s influential 1998 book, Adam Smith and the Virtues of Enlightenment, made much of this point, maintaining that for Smith the tremendous improvement wrought by commercial society in the material condition, and political status, of the poor compensates for its diminution of the place of traditional virtue.

Hanley takes a very different tack. Smith, he claims, concedes nothing to those who would dismiss the virtues of Christendom, or of ancient Greece and Rome. On the contrary, in Part VI of TMS Smith celebrates these virtues, shows how they can be integrated with one another, and suggests that they remain achievable, and must remain an aspiration for us, even in modern commercial society. Hanley understands the three main sections of TMS VI as offering a layered solution to the three main ways in which commercial society degrades virtue (8-9, 93). Capitalism fosters restless consumerism and vanity; the first section of Part VI describes a virtue — prudence — that can serve as a palliative to these vices. The prudent person delays gratification and seeks modest amounts of material goods, rather than endless luxury goods and high social status; the prudent person does not succumb to the vices that Mandeville and Rousseau attributed to commerce (103). Prudence can, however, be the mark of a small-minded, selfish person, and magnanimity, the “greatness of soul” on which Smith focuses in section ii of Part VI, is meant to be a corrective for this (129-34). But people who transcend small-minded selfishness by aspiring to great deeds can be cruel and condescending, so Smith adds a corrective for magnanimity to his account of virtue in section iii: the truly “wise and virtuous” person, he says there, will have a deep concern for all humanity, and aspire to great beneficence rather than mere nobility (169-75).

The wise and virtuous person will also model him or herself after an ideal of humanity that, Hanley argues, retains a more religious coloring than previous commentators have seen in the last edition of TMS. Smith’s ideally virtuous person, for Hanley, combines classical and Christian virtues. Further, what holds such a person’s virtues together, what allows him or her to move from prudence to magnanimity to beneficence, is that all three virtues represent modifications of self-love: we simply come to love deeper and nobler versions of ourselves at each stage (91, 104, 150). Self-love can be used to correct for the vices of self-love; Smith holds up an ancient and powerful vision of self-transcendence, says Hanley, as something that can be achieved precisely by making proper use of the deep structure of self-love (90-91). The new part VI of TMS thus recommends a way of living that incorporates classical and Christian ideals, suggesting that human beings in commercial society do not need to resign themselves to rampant consumerism, petty selfishness, or even a purely secular, mundane human goodness. Smith’s “practical system of Morality” in TMS VI allows modern liberals to maintain the transcendent horizons of medieval Christians and ancient Greeks and Romans.

I can’t stress strongly enough the novelty of this reading. Nothing in TMS explicitly suggests that the three kinds of virtue described in Part VI are supposed to build on one another, nor that they are meant as a corrective to the moral ills of modern commercial society. Nevertheless, Hanley finds an array of subtle hints that this is precisely what Smith meant to accomplish. Hanley is a deft and clever reader, using word choices and turns of phrases to link up widely disparate sections of the book (see 157-8, for instance, or the remarkable footnote on 197-8), applying Smith’s own comments on method in philosophy to explain why Part VI relies so heavily on character portraits (89-90, 159-60), and showing ingeniously how each section of Part VI can be understood as answering a question posed by an earlier discussion in TMS (109-23, 135-62, 178). Hanley is also steeped in the history of moral and political theory, and his book marvelously illuminates Smith’s relationship to Rousseau and Hutcheson, to Hobbes, and to Plato, Aristotle, and the Stoics. We are given a Smith quite different from the one we usually encounter: not the crude rational egoist of popular lore, but also not the civic republican, or the Enlightenment humanist, of most recent scholars. Rather, Hanley’s Smith wanted to preserve or revive a quite traditional conception of virtue in the face of the challenges of modernity. Such a sharp revision of the usual views of Smith might seem incredible if presented by a less astute scholar, but Hanley’s fine literary and historical skills make it look surprisingly plausible.

Nevertheless, I do have some reservations about Hanley’s thesis. The first is a textual one. Smith identified two main questions as central to moral philosophy — what is virtue? and what power or faculty in the mind recommends virtue to us? (TMS VII.i.2). A number of scholars read TMS as concerned with the second of these questions, to the virtual exclusion of the first. They understand the second question as essentially about the nature of moral judgment, and see Smith’s account of sympathy and the impartial spectator as an attempt to explain such judgment. A theory of virtue would on this account be a detailed description of what kind of person the impartial spectator approves of, and on this subject, previous scholars have maintained, Smith said virtually nothing in the first five editions of his book, and nothing very satisfactory in the new Part VI added to the sixth edition. Hanley seems to accept the understanding of Smith’s two questions that underlies these claims (10, 55-6), but argues that Part VI of TMS does a far better job at answering the “what is virtue?” question than previous scholars have supposed.

I think the standard understanding of Smith’s two questions is wholly misguided. Smith uses them to frame his account of the history of moral philosophy in TMS VII, and it is clear from the most casual reading of that account (1) that he is far more interested in answers to the first than to the second question (he spends almost 4 times as much space on them, and describes the second question very dismissively — VII.ii.intro — before taking it up), and (2) that he explicitly identifies his own views in the rest of TMS with positions he canvases on the first question, not the second one (with Plato’s answer to it, at VII.ii.1.11; with Aristotle’s, at VII.ii.1.12; with a qualified version of Stoicism, at VII.ii.1.47; with something like the positions of Clarke, Wollaston, and Shaftesbury, at VII.ii.1.48-49; with something like Hutcheson’s and Hume’s views at VII.ii.3.20-21; and with the position of Epicurus, from which he distinguishes his own, at VII.ii.2.13).

Smith seems to see the second question as primarily about the ground of moral judgment, rather than the nature of moral judgment — as the meta-ethical question about whether moral judgment rests on reason or feeling — and, as he expressly tells us (VII.ii.intro) he was not much interested in that. He seems to have regarded Hutcheson and Hume as having answered it (feeling is the basis of all moral judgment, but reason figures out what we should be judging and develops general moral rules out of our particular judgments). Given this textual evidence that Smith saw himself as responding to the first, not the second, of the basic moral questions he describes in TMS VII, I think we have to read even the early editions of his book as intended to give us a theory of virtue, not just of moral judgment. It is not hard to understand the book that way. Certainly, TMS deals in great detail with how moral judgment arises out of our attempt to reach mutual sympathy with others, but virtue is supposed to be what moral judgment is of, so an account of moral judgment should yield, if indirectly, an account of virtue as well, which is exactly what Smith tells us he is doing. Once we understand how moral judgment arises out of our yearning for sympathy, he says, we will understand the difference between the amiable and the awful virtues (I.i.5), why magnanimity is so admirable (I.iii.1.13-14), and the differences between beneficence and justice (II.ii1). So TMS provides a thorough-going account of the virtues by way of the way people come to judge of virtue. It is dedicated in its entirety to the first-order ethical questions that Smith tells us in Part VII are of real practical significance, not to meta-ethical investigations.

If that is so, one needs to ask whether the new Part VI , in the final edition of TMS, could possibly be contributing as much to Smith’s theory as Hanley suggests. It certainly illustrates virtue more vividly than Smith had done earlier, and perhaps that is meant, as Hanley suggests (159-60), to inspire the reader to action to a greater degree than anything else in the book had done. That isn’t the same as saying that it provides an answer to questions Smith had never addressed before, however, and there is little in the new Part, and nothing in the letter describing it, to suggest that Smith meant to do that. The idea that Smith expected his new Part VI to offer a solution he had never mentioned earlier to the greatest problems facing a proponent of virtue in the modern age is hard to swallow, and for all Hanley’s ingenious and thoughtful readings, I find myself unable fully to accept this claim.

My other reservation is a more systematic one. Even if Hanley is correct about what Smith is trying to do, he himself admits that Smith may in the end be unsuccessful (210). I think something stronger is in order. If Hanley’s reading of TMS VI is correct, Smith tried to show us how our very self-love might lead us to transcend petty selfishness and aspire to the noblest of classical and Christian ideals. Smith’s wise and virtuous man can inhabit a liberal, commercial society while seeking the good for his society, and for humanity as a whole, rather than anything like the individualist, materialist good more commonly associated with modern human beings. But nothing in TMS VI, even according to Hanley’s reconstruction, tells us how people might come to be wise and virtuous in the face of the consumerism fostered by commercial society and the lowering of horizons fostered by liberal democracy, or why such a person would hold up religious ideals in the face of a science that tends more and more to disenchant the world. Even on Hanley’s account, Smith offers us no justification for believing that classical and Christian ideals remain attainable in the modern world. It is not just that he was unsuccessful in arguing for the maintenance of such ideals, in that case; he did not really try to make any such argument.

To Hanley’s credit, he suggests at the very end of his book that Smith’s main aim in holding on to a pre-modern conception of virtue was not so much to show that it was still attainable as to keep alive in us the longing for such a conception (211-12), and that it is that longing we need if we are even to seek ways of making that conception attainable once again. This is surely true, and I share Hanley’s sense that a return to something like the pre-modern vision of virtue would be of great value. Hanley himself helps keep alive in his readers a longing for that vision. That alone makes his book very much worth reading. Hanley’s intriguing case that Smith retained a commitment to traditional virtues is one to which Smith scholars will need to attend for years to come. But what makes Hanley’s book most impressive and intriguing is his own rich evocation of the ideals that commercial society represses, and to which we might all still want to aspire.

1 Letter 287, in Correspondence of Adam Smith, ed. E. C. Mossner, Ian Simpson Ross, (New York: Oxford UP, second edition, 1987), pp. 319-20.