Adam Smith: His Life, Thought, and Legacy

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Ryan Patrick Hanley (ed.), Adam Smith: His Life, Thought, and Legacy, Princeton University Press, 2015, 571pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691154053.

Reviewed by Robert Fudge, Weber State University


Among the collections on Adam Smith that have appeared in recent years, this volume, compiled by Ryan Patrick Hanley, stands out because of both its scope and purpose. Each of the offering's 32 selections is short (roughly 12 pages each, not including notes or bibliography) and is intended to introduce some aspect of Smith's thought to those not already well versed in his writings. The contributors represent an impressive cross-section of Smith scholars, and the quality is consistently high throughout. The volume consists of five well-devised sections, and each piece concludes with a helpful narrative bibliography. Despite its virtues, however, the collection suffers from one major shortcoming -- almost no mention is made of Smith's thoughts on aesthetics and beauty, despite the prominent role these play in his essays and his moral philosophy. This omission is particularly surprising, given the volume's sheer size and number of contributions, and it stands as the book's most significant (and perhaps only) flaw.

Smith's work consists of three main sets of documents: the two books published during his lifetime (An Inquiry into the Nature and Causes of the Wealth of Nations (WN) and The Theory of Moral Sentiments (TMS)), two sets of student notes from his lectures at the University of Glasgow (Lectures on Rhetoric and Belles Lettres (LRBL) and Lectures on Jurisprudence (LJ)), and a set of essays that were compiled and published posthumously (Essays on Philosophical Subjects (EPS)).

Part I consists of five introductory essays on each of Smith's main writings, bookended by pieces on his life and his place within the Scottish Enlightenment. The section begins with James Buchan's "The Biography of Adam Smith." Rather than simply providing a scaled-down version of Smith's life, Buchan focuses more on the history of Smith biographies. Smith's life presents a challenge for biographers, as we simply do not possess any information about large stretches of his life. Nevertheless, his biographers hold out hope that there are still source documents tucked away in attics across Scotland that can help shed light on these periods. A point not to be overlooked is the glimpse Buchan gives of how Smith envisioned his grand philosophy would fit together, a theme that several other authors in this section address. Unfortunately, much of this grand project was never completed, so that "Smith's legacy is a vast ruin field of thought, a sort of Palmyra or Persepolis, in which two monumental columns survive erect and intact amid stones half achieved or half demolished. It is one of the sights of philosophy and . . . merits the detour" (15).

Though Smith never published a large-scale work on the topic of rhetoric and belles lettres (polite learning), its importance to him is reflected by the fact that it was the first topic on which he lectured after graduating from university, and he continued to teach on the topic for twelve years while at Glasgow (17). As Vivienne Brown notes in "The Lectures on Rhetoric and Belles Lettres," we must rely on student notes from his last year of teaching (1762-3), and given Smith's unwillingness to publish anything that he had not completed to his satisfaction, he almost certainly would be horrified by the thought of these notes being published as if they represented his final thoughts on the subject (18). Brown's piece is notable, first, for providing a concise and helpful overview of Smith's divisions of kinds of rhetoric and detailing his preference for didactic writing that lays down a single or small number of general principles, is clear (written in "the plain style"), and is free of metaphors and figures of speech. And second, Brown applies Smith's principles to his other works (specifically WN and TMS). While Smith hoped that his use of the plain style would lead to writings that do not lend themselves to multiple interpretations, the complexity of WN and TMS have proven otherwise.

As if to demonstrate this last point, Eric Schliesser's "The Theory of Moral Sentiments" devotes considerable time to explaining a number of Smith's central concepts, including the passions, sympathy, moral sentiment, the virtuous person, equitable justice, and, most controversially, the impartial spectator. Central to Schliesser's interpretation of the impartial spectator is the famous mirror passage, in which Smith argues that just as we could not recognize the beauty of our own face absent society, so we cannot know the virtue of our conduct absent social norms. Schliesser understands this to imply that the impartial spectator (a stand-in for our conscience) is socially constructed. While this reading of the passage is justifiable, the passage can also be read as offering the epistemological claim that society is necessary only for us to recognize our socially independent beauty and virtue. The defensibility of both interpretations again shows that writing in "the plain style" is not always sufficient for univocity of meaning.

Like LRBL, LJ is based on student notes (in the case of LJ, three separate sets). In this chapter, Knud Haakonssen is concerned with three tasks: explaining the two principles that Smith argues should underlie the laws of all nations, explaining in what sense Smith believed rights to be natural, and laying out how individuals living under the four different kinds of society (hunter-gatherer, nomadic, agricultural, and commercial) are susceptible to different kinds of injury, and hence will establish different kinds of rights. Despite arguing that rights and justice are socially constructed, Smith also believed that all laws should be based on the integrity of the individual and the extension of the person (for example, to property). Though these principles might reasonably be thought to ground a universal account of rights and justice, Smith claims that calling rights 'natural' simply means they are "obvious and pervasive," not universal (55). Whether Smith successfully pulls off this delicate balancing act is beyond the scope of Haakonssen's paper.

More than any other piece in this section, Jerry Evensky's "The Wealth of Nations" presents an ordered, section-by-section summary of the text in question. This is especially welcome, given that Part III deals entirely with issues pertaining to WN, and it is particularly impressive, given WN's density and length. Two things stand out from this summary. The first is Smith's concern with social progress (endemic throughout his works) and sense of historical direction, while the second is the special relevance Book V holds in its policy prescriptions. For Smith, proper policy should be directed toward the common good and will promote "the liberal plan of equality, liberty and justice" (87).

Published after Smith's death, EPS originally consisted of seven essays on topics covering the sciences and the arts, plus Dugald Stewart's biography of Smith. Given the length restrictions of this volume, Craig Smith's treatment of EPS by necessity could not cover all seven essays, and so he chose to focus on those four dealing with science. While an entirely defensible choice, it is nevertheless unfortunate, since (as noted above) aesthetic norms inform much of Smith's philosophy, and there are interesting and important ties between the arts-focused writings in EPS and TMS and WN. Concerning the essays on science, two important points should not be overlooked, though C. Smith tends to gloss over them. The first is how modern, and specifically Kuhnian, Smith's discussion of scientific progress sounds (96-7). The second is how, even here, aesthetic norms loom large (footnote 5 (102)). According to Smith, theoretical systems provide us aesthetic satisfaction by giving rise to the feeling of admiration as the system fits the available observations of what is being explained.

Nicholas Phillipson closes the first section with "Smith and the Scottish Enlightenment." This serves as a worthy companion piece to Buchan's biographical essay, as it situates Smith within the context of the Scottish Enlightenment and discusses both those who most influenced Smith and those whom he influenced. As with many of the pieces in this first section, Phillipson emphasizes the centrality of progress for Enlightenment thinkers, including Smith, for whom progress represents the ability of an advancing society to meet changing and increasing needs. Regrettably, neither the footnotes nor narrative bibliography include suggestions for further reading on this topic.

Part II turns to Smith's social vision and covers such topics as his account of the good life, the virtues, equality, justice, sympathy, and freedom.

The section begins with Hanley's "Adam Smith on Living a Life." Against those who would suggest that Smith is concerned primarily or entirely with providing an analysis of our moral concepts, Hanley clearly lays out Smith's account of the "wise and virtuous man" (133), whom Smith presents as an antidote to the fragmentation we all face in our lives. This fragmentation occurs, not only because of our psychologies (we are both selfish and other-regarding), but also because we desire to achieve both praise and praiseworthiness. This, in turn, requires that we perfect ourselves by cultivating both the amiable virtues of humanity and the awful virtues of self-command. In sum, we need to learn to care much for others and little for ourselves.

Leonidas Montes' "Adam Smith: Self-Interest and the Virtues" can easily be read as a companion piece to Hanley's. Pigeonholing Smith's moral theory can be challenging, as he does not clearly fit under the categories of either consequentialism or deontology. In light of Smith's additions to the sixth edition of TMS, Montes extends a recent line of interpretation that takes Smith to be primarily a virtue theorist. For Smith, the central virtues are prudence, beneficence, justice, and self-command, and Montes spends much of the piece spelling out what Smith means by these. In line with Aristotle, Smith believed that flourishing is not possible outside of a social context. Thus, his conception of sympathy, which ties us to others, also plays an important role in the cultivation of the virtues.

By their very nature, modern commercial societies include a degree of inequality. As Elizabeth Anderson argues in "Adam Smith on Equality," egalitarians will respond to this inequality differently. Radical egalitarians, like Rousseau, will take this inequality as a fatal objection against commercial society. Smith, being a moderate egalitarian, was willing to tolerate certain inequalities, since commercial society benefits everyone materially and frees us from our superiors. Further, Smith advocated for a variety of policies that can help mitigate inequality. Nevertheless, as Anderson notes, there remain at least four problems with commercial society that Smith either couldn't solve or didn't recognize that we must still struggle with. In sum, Anderson situates Smith within the broader debate (still ongoing) concerning commercial society's benefits and disadvantages.

Those familiar with Smith's TMS will be as frustrated by the first part of Nicholas Wolterstorff's "Adam Smith on Justice and Injustice" as those unfamiliar with TMS will appreciate it, for this is the first (and only) piece in the entire collection that provides a comprehensive, yet concise, overview of Smith's moral system. Wolterstorff provides this as prelude to what he considers Smith's "highly original" account of justice and injustice, which bases these concepts on the notion of justified resentment. Despite its originality, Wolterstorff considers Smith's account vulnerable to counterexamples of unjust actions that do not commit real and positive harms (for example, undetected voyeurism or benevolent slavery). Put another way, Smith doesn't seem able to account for injustices that violate an individual's worth or dignity and that don't also cause direct harm. It is unclear whether this should represent the final word on Smith's account. As Wolterstorff points out in his final footnote, Smith has a passage in which he comes tantalizingly close to allowing that violations of dignity constitute injustice. While this concession might not stick to the letter of Smith's theory, it may nevertheless make it more defensible.

Someone with a passing interest in Smith's moral theory will likely focus on the role he assigns to sympathy in forming moral judgments. But as Remy Debes shows in "Adam Smith and the Sympathetic Imagination," Smith's understanding of sympathy has implications well beyond this. In particular, his imagination-based account of sympathy underlies his conception of human social nature and provides a powerful response to Mandeville's egoism. Most central to Debes' argument is Smith's claim that we are anxious to be praiseworthy, which in turn motivates us to cultivate the virtues (another way of saying "we desire to be 'really fit' for society" (205)), and so it is this, rather than benevolence, that underlies Smith's critique of egoism.

David Schmidtz closes Part II with "Adam Smith on Freedom." While Smith did not develop a theory of freedom, the promotion of freedom was at the forefront of his defense of market society, since the wealth it generates frees people from poverty and starvation, and it frees workers from the servility entailed by feudalism. Nevertheless, market society does present a number of challenges to our freedom, including the power of crony capitalists and "men of system," by whom Smith means people who believe they can control us as if we were pawns in a game. Further, market society can leave us divided against ourselves. For example, we keep working even after our needs are met, despite this not materially increasing our happiness; specializing can lead to mental atrophy, both on the factory floor and in white-collar work; and our tendency to seek out kindred spirits leaves us vulnerable to social pressure in what we believe and value and in how we act. These real and present dangers of market society remain with us today, and Smith was right to note the importance of working to address them.

Part III focuses exclusively on Smith's writings on economics. Those not working in economics might wonder about Smith's influence on and continuing relevance for the discipline. Agnar Sandmo's "Adam Smith and Modern Economics" addresses these questions, specifically by focusing on Smith's theory of price, his interest in the relationship between commercial economy and the public interest, his thoughts on the proper role of the state, and his account of economic growth. Of particular note is Smith's embrace of economics as both a positive and normative discipline, the latter of which concerns the claim that commercial society promotes the public interest. Many passages in WN suggest that the public interest especially concerns the well-being of the poor, which ties Smith's economics into considerations of morality and justice. This aspect of Smith's thought can thus be considered a precursor to the field of welfare economics. Another important aspect of Sandmo's piece concerns the regulatory role of the state (a topic already addressed in the earlier pieces by Evensky and Anderson). But perhaps the most important lesson to take from Sandmo's piece concerns WN's relevance to contemporary economists. While the field of economics has advanced well beyond the state it was in when Smith was writing, it nevertheless requires that researchers be able to intuit the connections between theoretical models and the actual economy; in this respect, Smith remains worthy of emulation (244).

As suggested by its title, Maria Pia Paganelli's "Adam Smith and the History of Economic Thought: The Case of Banking" is much more narrowly focused than Sandmo's piece. While much of what Smith writes about the banking system is antiquated, there nevertheless remains an apparent inconsistency at the heart of his thought, as he advocated for both a self-regulating market and state regulations and interventions in the banking system. The key to resolving this conflict is to recognize that wealth creation cannot be dissociated from morality or justice, thus explaining Smith's repeated references to "judicious" banking. Thus, Smith called for specific regulations against banks, including the banning of small notes and a ban on the "option clause" that could temporarily suspend the convertibility of notes into coinage (254). In sum, the regulations Smith advocated for would, he believed, allow for competition that maximizes the well-being of the majority.

Though Smith was not an experimental economist, his thinking on economics and moral psychology has important implications for the field. In "Adam Smith and Experimental Economics: Sentiments to Wealth," Vernon L. Smith provides an intellectual biography of A. Smith's influence on his own work. The details of this piece are somewhat technical and not easily summarized, and the flow of topics is at times not clear or obvious. The upshot, however, is significant; namely, A. Smith's rules of propriety can better account for decision-making in small group interactions than the neoclassical utilitarian framework.

Amartya Sen closes Part III with "Adam Smith and Economic Development." Smith has not historically been understood to offer much in the way of economic development theory, as he focused primarily on the economics of Britain, France, and Europe more broadly. Yet, three facts tell in favor of his being understood as writing on economic development: Britain, France, and Europe as a whole were not particularly wealthy during the 18th century; Smith's economic thought was thoroughly grounded in his moral/political philosophy; and development economics is not restricted simply to the economics of developing countries (282-3). The rest of Sen's piece focuses on a variety of areas of development economics that Smith discussed, including the early development of trade, the limitations of the market mechanism in developing economies, the state's role in helping to alleviate poverty and provide universal education, and the human traits that must be cultivated for a market economy to function well. In sum, like the preceding essay, Sen's demonstrates the relevance of Smith's thought to contemporary economic thinking.

As suggested by the breadth of topics covered by the previous essays, the scope of Smith's interests was significant. Part IV -- "Smith Beyond Economics" -- is a bit of a catch-all that covers topics ranging from Smith's ideas about religion, politics, rhetoric, and jurisprudence, as well as his relevance for such areas as modern ethics, feminist ethics, narrative, the history of philosophy, and Enlightenment studies.

As Gordon Graham writes in "Adam Smith and Religion," Smith is notoriously difficult to pin down on this topic and has left himself open to a variety of interpretations. Concerning Smith's personal religious beliefs, there is very little material on which to build a case. However, it would seem that Smith was rather conventional, accepting "true religion" while (like Hume) rejecting anything that smacked of superstition or "enthusiasm." There is equally little material to draw on that suggests any significant theology underlying Smith's philosophy. He did attribute omnipotence and omniscience to the "Author of Nature," posited that the purpose of the world's natural order is human happiness, and assigned to God the role of judge. However, Graham notes, even if Smith considered these ideas important, none of them seems essential to his system. Much more significant for Smith is the role religion plays in buttressing the individual's moral agency and promoting beneficial social systems. In sum, Graham agrees that it is mistaken to think that religion plays no important role in Smith's thought, but he also makes clear that neither does the strength of the system rest on religious foundations.

As with Smith's thoughts on religion, there is no single place to find his fully thought-out ideas on politics. As Lisa Hill notes in "Adam Smith and Political Theory," the result is an ongoing debate about where to situate Smith along the continuum of current political ideologies. For Hill, this represents a mistake, given the importance he assigned to "natural liberty" (the idea that social systems are self-ordering and self-equilibrating). In sum, Smith thinks political economy should both benefit the people and provide for public works (325). Thus, he argued for the kinds of state interventions already mentioned on several occasions in this review, while warning against the man of system. His objections to imperialism and mercantilism seem similarly motivated by his faith in the system of natural liberty, which can only be upheld through the guidance of wise political leaders for whom public welfare and an appreciation of natural liberty are paramount.

The next two pieces focus on the relevance of Smith's writings to contemporary issues in moral philosophy. The first, Lisa Herzog's "Adam Smith and Modern Ethics," concerns the nature of the self and its relevance to ethics. A variety of modern philosophical traditions have denied the existence of an autonomous moral self, emphasizing instead the influence of social norms on our moral development. Herzog rightly notes that Smith was fully aware of, and wrestled with, the tension between social influences and the search for objective moral norms. As noted earlier, Schliesser's essay emphasizes the role Smith assigns social norms in molding our moral selves. At the same time, however, Smith considered the impartial spectator a higher tribunal to whom we could appeal in making moral judgments. Ultimately, the comparative importance of each of these influences remained unresolved for Smith, just as it arguably is for us.

Annette Baier famously argued that Hume could serve as a model for feminist ethics. In "Adam Smith and Feminist Ethics: Sympathy, Resentment, and Solidarity," Jacqueline Taylor persuasively argues that the same can be said for Smith. In particular, his imagination-based account of sympathy (as opposed to Hume's emotional contagion-based approach), combined with his explication of justified resentment, can supplement contemporary feminist writings in the protection and promotion of justice and dignity.

The notion of resentment also holds a central place in Smith's theory of jurisprudence, as demonstrated by Chad Flanders' "Adam Smith's Jurisprudence: Resentment, Punishment, Justice." Of special note is Flanders' explanation of resentment as an emotion that arises from another committing an unjustified harm, and it, in turn, involves a desire not just to see the wrongdoer suffer harm, but also that the wrongdoer suffer harm because of the original unjust act. If this sentiment is to underlie our sense of justice and our jurisprudence, it needs a more objective basis, and this again is where Smith appeals to the impartial spectator. The closer our actual system of justice comes to approximating that which the impartial spectator deems proper, the closer we come to having a system of natural jurisprudence.

Chapters 23 and 24 both deal with rhetoric. Stephen McKenna's "Adam Smith and Rhetoric" situates Smith's ideas on the subject (to the degree that we really know them) within the context of both Enlightenment rhetoric theory and the history of rhetoric at large. But even for those not particularly well-versed or interested in rhetoric, McKenna suggests that Smith's understanding of it has special relevance to the development of character and "could be envisioned once again at the center of a liberal arts education, as an essential part of the conscious design of a decent society" (400).

Karen Valihora's "Adam Smith's Narrative Line" takes a fascinating look at how Smith employs rhetorical devices -- particularly the shifting between first- and third-person narrative perspectives -- in TMS. Even more strikingly, Valihora compares the use of different narrative voices in Jane Austen's Pride and Prejudice with Smith's use of these voices in TMS to critique the nobleman and elevate the "man of abilities" (417). With other writers, one might wonder whether this use of shifting narrative voice is intentional. However, Smith's deep interest in rhetoric suggests that his use of this shift was calculated and used to great effect.

The final two pieces in this section concern Smith's place in the history of philosophy and within the Scottish Enlightenment, respectively. In "Adam Smith and the History of Philosophy," Michaƫl Biziou seeks to complete two tasks: first, to situate Smith as a philosophical figure, and second, to establish Smith's position in the history of philosophy, especially with respect to what philosophers influenced his own thought. Establishing Smith's position as a philosopher is not difficult. He wrote and taught on many different philosophical subjects, including ethics, jurisprudence, the history of philosophy, epistemology, and natural philosophy, among others. None of this is new to those acquainted with his writings. The second half of Biziou's piece is more illuminating, as it lays out the myriad philosophical influences on Smith, both earlier and contemporary. Considerations of length prevent Biziou from going into much detail on these, but as he notes, the very scope of these influences provides numerous research projects for historians of philosophy.

Fredrik Albritton Jonsson closes the section with "Adam Smith and Enlightenment Studies," a fascinating look at different interpretations of the Enlightenment and Smith's place within it. The first section of the piece (regrettably but necessarily short) considers three different models of the Enlightenment, which differ with respect to the movement's "origin, chronology, and character" (444). The following three sections concern three aspects of Smith's thought -- his manufacturing vision, his political economy (particularly his critique of empire and slavery), and his understanding of the environment -- and how these situate him within the Enlightenment at large.

The fifth and final section concerns Smith's influence "beyond the academy," and it kicks off with Gavin Kennedy's "Adam Smith: Some Popular Uses and Abuses." As with many significant thinkers, the basics of Smith's ideas are widely known. However, many of these have become distorted or simply misunderstood, especially when not considered in the context of Smith's broader thought. Kennedy discusses four such misunderstandings. The first concerns the notion of laissez-faire economics, which is often used to justify rolling back regulations on commercial interests. Smith was much more interested in personal freedom and very much appreciated the dangers of unregulated merchants who act against the common good. The second is the use (often by center-right politicians) of the invisible hand metaphor to justify unregulated free markets. But Smith used this metaphor only to show what consequences, both good and bad, can arise from the actions of free agents. The third misunderstanding concerns the reading of self-interest as selfishness and the consequent generation of the "Adam Smith problem," which has been debunked ad nauseam. Finally, Smith's ideas about self-interest have led to the position that he endorsed a view of bargaining as a zero-sum game, when in fact his ideas on cooperation and bargaining clearly characterize it as a positive-sum game.

The next two pieces -- Samuel Fleischacker's "Adam Smith and the Left" and James R. Otteson's "Adam Smith and the Right" -- debate which side of our contemporary political spectrum can most plausibly claim Smith as one of their own. Both begin by defining the terms of the debate, with Fleischacker identifying five characteristic features of the left and Otteson focusing on the differences between being a centralist vs. a decentralist with respect to the state. The impression the reader is left with is that both authors are correct. Smith certainly did advocate for reforms that contemporary liberals would approve of (respecting and providing for the poor, applying reason to reform society, separating church and state, etc.), but at the same time was highly suspicious of the man of system. In sum, the picture that emerges is a thinker who represents precisely the sort of political moderate currently in distressingly short supply.

Smith has garnered significant attention recently in China, as Luo Wei-Dong outlines in "Adam Smith and China: From Ideology to Academia." Since Smith's introduction to China with Yuan Fu's translation of WN, the interpretation of Smith was often clouded by prevailing ideologies, treating Smith by turns as a proto-Marxist and economic liberal. However, the rise of interest in Scottish Enlightenment studies during the past few decades has led Chinese scholars to begin separating out Smith's "true" thought from ideology: "such ideological color has begun to fade and more exploration of the 'facts' from the perspectives of history and careful textual study has been carried out" (522). Translations of some of the more important works in the secondary literature have helped to spur this movement.

The final two pieces concern specific issues from WN that continue to resonate. John C. Bogle's "Adam Smith and Shareholder Capitalism" concerns Smith's worries about conflicts of interest that can arise in corporate conduct and governance. In particular, Smith worried that financial managers would not exercise the same care in handling others' money that they would in handling their own, and he understood the dangers of bankers engaging in speculative ventures in the hopes of achieving high returns. History has proven Smith correct on both these counts. Financial institutions, rather than individual investors, now hold most stock, with the result that financial markets are treated like casinos. Further, these institutional investors show little interest in the governance of the companies whose stock they own. And, of course, the financial crisis of 2008-2009 is due in large part to financial institutions engaging in risky investments while maximally leveraging their assets.

Douglas A. Irwin's "Adam Smith and Free Trade" also demonstrates the relevance of Smith's thought to current events. Among Smith's most important contributions were his arguments concerning the mutually beneficial aspects of free trade and the economic costs of mercantilism. Economists remain divided on the overall effects of free trade and the issue of when restrictions are appropriate. However, Smith was the first to frame the debate in terms of increasing national wealth and revenue, rather than increasing power or manufacturing capability (548). All of these issues are very much in play as the United States currently seeks to renegotiate NAFTA and has rejected participation in the Trans-Pacific Partnership, going against Smith's vision of free trade as a positive-sum game.