Adam Smith's Marketplace of Life

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Otteson, James R., Adam Smith's Marketplace of Life, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 338pp, $26.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521016568.

Reviewed by Robert McCarthy , Key School, Annapolis MD


In Adam Smith’s Marketplace of Life, James Otteson offers a thought-provoking approach to the unity of Adam Smith’s philosophical work. Otteson defines the “Adam Smith problem” as follows:

how could the same person who wrote The Theory of Moral Sentiments, which apparently established a natural ’sympathy’ as the cement of human society, go on to write The Wealth of Nations, which seemed to argue that economic policy should be predicated on the assumption that people are fundamentally self-interested? (p. 2)

Instead of looking for the solution to this problem in individual moral psychology – in the motives that lead us to either moral action or to self-interested commerce – Otteson finds it primarily in the market mechanisms by which society transforms these diverse motives into “unintended order.”

Otteson’s attention to the mechanistic character of Smith’s psychology is a strength of the book. His language (calling the impartial spectator a ’procedure,’ for example) shows that he sees clearly that Smith’s method is to give a causal account of human behavior in terms of the interaction of human passions. The passions are simple, but interact in complex ways. It is from this basis that what Otteson calls “unintended order” arises. People acting on “basic, natural drives” cause “an order that they did not consciously intend to create but that nevertheless unfolds on its own and serves both to strengthen the interpersonal bonds and increase the wealth of the community” (p. 6). It is Smith’s interest in this phenomenon, according to Otteson, that unites his two major works. In particular, Otteson argues, the impartial spectator is the tool that in both works produces this order, through the mechanisms of the marketplace.

Otteson begins with an account of the function of sympathy in The Theory of Moral Sentiments. Sympathy underlies the “impartial spectator procedure,” as Otteson calls it. It is through sympathetic connection that we are able to put ourselves in the position of others in order to judge them or ourselves. Otteson helpfully points out Smith’s lack of consistency in the use of the word “sympathy”. “Roughly, Smith’s three meanings of sympathy, in order, are: natural fellow feeling for others, pity for others, and correspondence of sentiments between two or more people” (p. 17). He fails, however, to appreciate the role different senses of sympathy play in the impartial spectator’s judgments of propriety. Otteson argues that the third sense of sympathy listed above is the basis of Smith’s moral theory (p. 18).

What happens is this. We see the misery or happiness of another, we imagine ourselves in the same situation, and a real or imagined feeling wells up in us as a result of this imaginative changing of place. We then compare what our own feelings would be if we were in the other’s situation with what his actual feelings are in his situation. If our respective feelings are commensurate, Smith says that we sympathize with that other; if they are not, we do not. Thus sympathy is correspondence between the imagined feelings of the spectator and the actual sentiments of the person primarily concerned. (p. 19)

This cannot be a simple instance of sympathy, however, as it already involves two acts of sympathy. For Smith, “we have no immediate experience of what other men feel,” (TMS I, I, I) so knowing what the person primarily concerned feels requires an act of sympathy, as does imaginatively projecting myself into another’s position. ’Sympathy’ understood as the correspondence mentioned above, then, must be a correspondence between two acts of sympathy, not itself a single act. I compare what I imagine I would feel were I in the situation I observe (one form of sympathy) and compare that with what I imagine the person to be feeling on the basis of the behavior I can observe (another form of sympathy). The situation becomes still more complicated when we look at self-command, Smith’s cardinal virtue. Self-command consists in my adjusting my reactions to the pitch I imagine will allow others to sympathize. That is, I have to sympathize with other people’s impartial spectators, and act as though my experience is no more intense than others imagine it to be. For Smith morality is essentially social – without the constant balancing of sympathetic judgments, there can be no moral judgments. That I can judge an act to be proper, or in other ways virtuous, is a result of my reaction to my perception of others’ judgments of me. On Otteson’s account, this essentially social nature of moral judgment is not made sufficiently clear.

Otteson spends significant time comparing Smith with Hume on the role of utility in moral judgment. Though Smith, not Hume, is the focus of Otteson’s book, it seems worth mentioning that Hume is a thinker of significantly more complexity than Otteson allows. Otteson treats Hume as a simple utilitarian: “utility ultimately underlies all moral judgments” (p. 52). This view is based on Smith’s own view, expressed at several points in TMS, but Otteson supports it with his own reading of Hume’s Treatise and Enquiries. However, Hume does not found all moral judgments on utility. The Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals, for example, distinguishes between useful qualities and ’immediately agreeable’ qualities. Otteson correctly points out that for Hume considerations of utility can influence aesthetic judgments, but it is also the case for Hume that there is no extra-aesthetic foundation for utility. That is, utility is valuable because it pleases us. Utility influences our aesthetic sense, but aesthetics influences our judgment of utility. Our interests are not fundamentally distinct from enjoyments. There is a mechanism of mutual influence here that is in some ways similar to that involved in Smith’s sympathy. However, for Hume the feedback happens within one person’s experience, whereas for Smith it takes place only within society.

The critical question is whether ethical and aesthetic judgment are fundamentally the same or different. For Smith, there is a fundamental distinction between the two, whereas for Hume there is not. This distinction rests on the difference in the operation of sympathy between the two systems. For Smith, moral judgment is constituted socially; it comes into being only in the interaction of sympathetic actors in society. For Hume on the other hand, sympathy plays a more limited role. Hume’s moral judgments are fundamentally a matter of each person’s sentiments; sympathy is needed only in order to broaden my judgments, not to constitute them. What Hume lacks is the double action of sympathy I described above – sympathy lets me feel what another feels, but it does not allow me to compare what another feels with what I would feel in the other’s place.

This view of sympathy has consequences for the “Adam Smith problem.” Sympathy is “the cement of human society,” in the sense that it is essential to society’s ability to develop moral (and, as Otteson argues, other) rules by which to govern itself. This is not, however, in conflict with self-interest, or with the idea that self-interest should govern economic policy. Sympathy, in the important sense, is not a motive, but a mechanism for correcting our motives. Our desire for sympathy is a motive, but not a motive for universal benevolence. There is no reason why, when doing business, sympathy would prevent my acting in a self-interested manner. Even propriety need not condemn self-interest. I can sympathize with a businessman’s desire to maximize his profits, and find it entirely proper that he charge what the market will bear, though I would not consider it proper if he cheats his customers. There is thus no problem with reading Wealth of Nations as an application of the moral system of Theory of Moral Sentiments to the world of commerce. The differences in vocabulary between the two books remain somewhat strange, as Otteson points out, but that is equally a problem for any account of the unity of Smith’s work.

That the “Adam Smith problem” is less intractable than Otteson believes, however, does not detract from the real strength of the book, which is Otteson’s use of the market model to account for the development of unintentional order. That is, the ’impartial spectator’ in moral theory and the ’invisible hand’ in economic theory have similar structures. Otteson summarizes the market structure as follows:

a system of order arising unintentionally from individual actions, an increasing complexity of the system over time in relation to the increasing sophistication of individuals, a slow and gradual process leading to the formalization of rules, the conformity of the system’s rules to the time and place of its instantiation, the system’s dependence on free and continual exchanges between and among individuals, and the natural desires of human beings as the motive force behind the creation and development of the system. (p. 182)

That is, natural human desire evolves, through the free interaction of increasingly complex groups of individuals, into complex, rule-governed systems. This is, according to Otteson, equally true for Smith of economic and moral behavior. In both cases, order arises from the undirected interaction of simple, natural, human passions. This structural similarity, conjoined with what Otteson calls “the familiarity principle,” becomes the core of Otteson’s answer to the “Adam Smith problem.” It is ironic that some of Otteson’s best insights arose as a result of an unnecessary investigation.

Also worthy of attention is Otteson’s claim that Smith’s market-based moral theory leads to a “union of, on the one hand, a kind of Burkean conservatism, which tends towards the stability of society, with, on the other hand, a respect for progressive development, which allows for creativity and innovation in society” (p. 322). This is truly one of Smith’s great contributions: he rejects the application of naïve rationalism to society, but provides us with a mechanism by which social change can be both understood and evaluated. Otteson’s particular way of connecting The Theory of Moral Sentiments with The Wealth of Nations does an excellent job of making this clear. That social order evolves unintentionally from complex human interaction is a Burkean point, but Smith’s analysis of the mechanisms of that evolution shows that conservatism need not be hidebound. In Otteson’s words, “Smithian antirationalism and moral conservatism do not imply that a society’s established moral rules are absolutely, transcendently true or that they are beyond scrutiny. Indeed, the very notion of these rules developing implies rather that they are in constant states of modification or emendation” (p. 323). That this evolution takes place as an unintended consequence of a series of individual acts is the basis for a strong argument in favor of a free society. Otteson deserves credit for elucidating this basis.