Adaptationism and Optimality

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Orzack, Steven Hecht and Elliot Sober (eds.), Adaptationism and Optimality, Cambridge University Press, 2001, 404 pp, $28.00 (pbk), ISBN 0-521-59836-2.

Reviewed by Roberta Millstein, California State University, Hayward


As one of the preliminary pages of Adaptationism and Optimality states, debates over the relative importance of natural selection in evolution are both longstanding and central to the field. The debates have often become heated, and so any review of a book on these topics must ask: Does the book provide an up-to-date picture of the adaptationist debate? Does it succeed in clarifying the terms of the debate? And most importantly, has the field responded to its critics (particularly to the accusation of untestability), and are these responses satisfactory? The answers to these questions are mostly “yes,” although some essays do a better job addressing them than others do, as I will argue below.

Adaptationism and Optimality is a collection of commissioned essays by distinguished biologists and philosophers, weighted a bit towards biologists over philosophers (perhaps due to the editors’ stated goal of showing that this debate is relevant to “biologists in the trenches”). The authors represent a wide range of opinions and approaches and focus on different aspects of the debate. However, considering the book as a whole, there are a few areas where it could be improved. I would characterize the authors’ views as ranging from strongly adaptationist to more weakly adaptationist. Although some of the authors critique various aspects of the stronger adaptationist positions, there are none that I would characterize as “anti-adaptationist,” a position perhaps best exemplified by Stephen Jay Gould and Richard Lewontin’s (in)famous 1979 essay. The inclusion of an anti-adaptationist essay or two would have helped to round out the volume and to ensure that the authors are responding to the latest and best of the adaptationist critiques (if any). Still, Gould and Lewontin’s presence is strongly felt here in that several of the authors are explicitly responding to (even, in some respects, agreeing with) Gould and Lewontin. Furthermore, given the title of the book, it would not be unreasonable to argue that one of its purposes is to present the current state of the adaptationist program. Let the anti-adaptationists write their own book. The book would also have benefited from greater interaction between the various authors – that is, having them comment on one another’s essays in this volume, and not just comment on their previous works – or, lacking that, an overall piece at the end that reflected back on the preceding essays. (Below, I point out a few places where dialogue between the authors would have been beneficial). In spite of these few shortcomings, I would emphasize that, on the whole, the book is an important contribution to the topic of adaptationism and a good reflection of the “state of the art” in the field, particularly with regard to the testing of adaptationism. I have no doubt that it will be an essential reference for many years to come.

Now to the particular essays themselves. Of course, I could not possibly do full justice to any of these essays in a review of this length, and my remarks will be extremely brief. An additional problem for any reviewer of these controversial issues is raised by the heatedness of the debate. One might strive to be impartial, and yet by being impartial, is one already taking a stand? The very terms in which the debate is cast imply this difficulty.1 In the “Introduction,” the editors, Orzack and Sober, define adaptationism as “the claim that natural selection is the only important cause of the evolution of most nonmolecular traits” (not just “an” important cause or one cause among many) “and that these traits are locally optimal” (6; emphasis added),2 . Thus, even to admit the possibility that there are other important causes of evolution runs the risk of taking a side against the adaptationist. I shall have to take that risk, however, if this is to be any sort of critical essay. Thus, my yardstick in evaluating each essay shall be: to what extent does the essay further the debate over adaptationism – does it clarify or provide direction in settling the debate? Or does it simply reiterate the adaptationist position with little or no consideration of other side? This yardstick may appear to beg the question against the adaptationist, and yet any good argument must consider its opposition, if only to expose its flaws. If I beg the question, I beg the question against a poor argument.

Nonetheless, by the stated yardstick, most of the essays do quite well. Of the more “biological/scientific” of the essays (appearing towards the beginning of the book), those by David Baum and Michael Donoghue; Orzack and Sober; Hudson Reeve and Paul Sherman; Edward Herre, Carlos Machado, and Stuart West; George Gilchrist and Joel Kingsolver; and Kenneth Halama and David Reznick all advance the debate over adaptationism.

Baum and Donoghue develop and argue for a likelihood framework for the testing of adaptationist hypotheses. This method allows them to “consider evidence in favor of alternative hypotheses” such as a hypothesis of genetic drift, rather than “just looking at the evidence for adaptation”; the measure of the degree of evidence for the adaptationist hypothesis is given by “the ratio of the likelihood that the character would have evolved via natural selection for the specified role versus the likelihood that it would have evolved without such selection,” (30; emphasis in original).

Orzack and Sober focus on developing a test to distinguish between the alternative hypotheses of phylogenetic inertia (organisms have a particular trait because their ancestors did) and natural selection (organisms have a particular trait because it is adaptive and has been selected for). They emphasize that neither explanation should be used as a null hypothesis, because the null hypothesis ends up being given precedence over the other hypothesis. Instead, their method of “controlled comparisons” requires that when one tests for selection, one must control for the possibility of phylogenetic intertia, and vice versa.

Reeve and Sherman’s essay does not take the “test both sides” approach that many of the other essays take. Instead, they take on the nonadaptationist approach directly, and attempt to demonstrate the provocative thesis that “phylogenetic analyses alone are neither necessary nor sufficient to test hypotheses about phenotype existence” (104). They argue against the use of parsimony-based phylogenetic methods. It is not surprising to hear that the authors’ arguments have already evoked an “enthusiastic response” in defense of these methods, and the authors’ prediction that more are forthcoming is sure to be borne out.

Herre, Machado, and West focus on the specific case of fig-wasp sex-ratios in order to draw more general conclusions concerning the testing of adaptation. They show how the predictions of a local mate competition optimality model (where there is selection for female-biased sex ratios) are qualitatively supported in fig wasps, but are seldom quantitatively supported. They argue that it is difficult to draw conclusions from these results – that in using this (and any) optimality model, one must also test the assumptions of the model in order to come to any conclusions about the results. They consider themselves to be adding additional testing requirements to those specified by Orzack and Sober (1994a, b). This excellent essay raises a number of important issues (e.g., regarding variation, the role of the environment, and the goals of testing adaptationist hypotheses) that I cannot do justice to here.

Gilchrist and Kingsolver focus on fitness landscapes, arguing that studies of optimality have focused on fitness peaks without consideration of the topography. They consider the implications of various peak shapes for adaptation, including a study of landscapes under temporally varying environments, and discuss the ways that various shapes can provide evidence for and against adaptationist hypotheses.

Halama and Reznick focus on the implication of variation for adaptationism. One might argue that variation is the result of “neutral forces,” or one might argue that the variation is in some way adaptive. They suggest that much of the literature on adaptive variation has been overlooked, and provide a survey of studies of adaptive variation, focusing specifically on the ways in which density-dependent selection, frequency-dependent selection, disruptive selection, and selection in heterogeneous environments can sustain variation in a population. This essay is worthwhile for drawing our attention to this body of literature (and not making what Abrams calls in his essay the “usual adaptationist assumption” that selection depletes variation), but it leaves too many questions unanswered – in particular whether there are alternative hypotheses for the populations under study and the extent to which these alternative hypotheses have been considered. Thus, it furthers the debate, but more work needs to be done on the important question of variation.

One might very well ask how I could endorse this variety of approaches. However, I think in this case, there is strength in variety. A number of different approaches to adaptationism may be exactly what we need, especially when (as is the case here) authors are focusing on different aspects of the problem.

Less helpful, I would argue, are the essay by Joel Brown and the essay by Ilan Eshel and Marcus Feldman.

Brown’s essay decries the minor role that natural selection has played in evolutionary explanations of biological diversity, speciation, and the history of life, and seeks to make natural selection the prominent explanation for evolutionary phenomena at every scale. He shows how this can be done through game-theoretic models, arguing that the success of his endeavor should be judged by “how it can color the way we think about nature, enlarge the scope of interesting questions, inspire new research, and solve applied problems” (117). Although fruitfulness is important, and indeed, it will be interesting to see whether Brown’s approach proves successful, it is not the only criterion by which an approach should be judged. Furthermore, as Orzack and Sober’s essay emphasizes, it is a mistake to focus one’s efforts on one cause without any consideration of other possible causes. When Brown considers the reasons why an optimality model may fail (and failure on his view is qualitative failure, not just quantitative failure), and none of the reasons mentioned includes the possibility that there are nonselective processes at work in this case (he includes only the most extreme nonadaptationist reason, “the basic premise of the optimality approach is wrong”), then it is hard not to see this as “simplistic adaptationism” (to use his phrase).

Eshel and Feldman distinguish between short-term evolution (the dynamics of the relative frequencies of a finite, fixed set of genotypes) and long-term evolution (the “trial and error” process by which mutation introduces new genotypes into the population). Arguing that the two processes are qualitatively different, they conclude that whereas with short-term models “convergence to individual local optima is likely to occur only under the specific assumptions of often unrealistically simple models,” with long-term models “phenotypic changes…tend to converge in the long term and, with probability 1, to local optima.” However, models are only as good as their assumptions, and by Eshel and Feldman’s own admission, their models assume a constant environment (Brown’s models, discussed above, seem to assume this as well). As Abrams states, “significant environmental variability may be the rule rather than the exception in natural systems,” (273-4). If this is the case, then the applicability of the models is severely restricted.

Of the four essays that are of a more “philosophical/historical” bent, the essays by Peter Abrams, Ron Amundson, and Peter Godfrey-Smith succeed admirably in clarifying the some of the terms of the debate, an achievement which can (in the ideal) help pave the way towards resolution.

Abrams argues that even if one successfully demonstrates that natural selection is the most important evolutionary force acting on a trait, this implies neither its adaptiveness nor its optimality. He states that “exact optimality seems unlikely and may never occur” (285) and that adaptation probably occurs frequently (but not always, and it is difficult to say how frequently). Nonetheless, he argues that optimality models can be very useful in discovering the selective mechanism underlying a given trait, providing, in some circumstances, the only reasonable way to determine which traits would be adaptive. However, in order to determine which mechanism (selective or nonselective) is operating, we must focus not on whether the traits are optimal, but on the dynamics of change in the population.

Admundson’s essay traces the roots of today’s developmentalists and adaptationists back to debates in the nineteenth century and demonstrates how and why the two sides often talk past one another. Amundson is pessimistic concerning the possibility of a synthesis of the two, and yet his analysis seems to suggest that the two approaches are focused on different aspects of the same phenomena, rather than being contradictory. Thus, a synthesis should be possible in principle, if the two sides can lay down their swords for a time.

Godfrey-Smith’s essay clarifies that there are really three adaptationist debates: an empirical debate over the prevalence of natural selection, an explanatory debate over whether adaptation is the “core intellectual mission of evolutionary theory,” and a methodological debate over whether we ought to be looking for adaptations in nature. Godfrey-Smith argues that although there are relationships between the three debates, they are logically independent of one another, and he gives a general discussion as to how each of the debates might be resolved.

Egbert Giles Leigh, Jr. purports to solve the question of the prevalence of adaptation in a one-page discussion of Aristotle. Although I have striven to remain charitable in my critiques, I cannot help but ask here whether we have returned to the Middle Ages where one need only cite the authority of Aristotle to uphold one's point. Can it be that all the disputants in the adaptationist debate need only to read Aristotle, where all their disagreements are settled? Other longstanding debates are also dispatched summarily by Leigh's essay: the definition of adaptation, the question of constraint, the testing of adaptive explanations. Leigh admits to being an "incorrigible adaptationist," but his sketchy treatment of the issues gives adaptationism a bad name.

However, I do not want to end my review on a bad note. As should be clear from the above, overall I found the essays interesting, provocative, and informative. They document the fact that adaptationism has progressed in the last twenty years. Adaptationism and Optimality furthers the debates over adaptationism and should provide the basis of discussion and research for many years to come.


Brandon, R. N. and M. D. Rausher (1996), “Testing Adaptationism: A Comment on Orzack and Sober”, American Naturalist 148: 189-201.

Gould, S. J. and R. C. Lewontin (1979), “The Spandrels of San Marco and the Panglossian Paradigm: A Critique of the Adaptationist Programme”, Proceedings of the Royal Society of London, B 205: 581-598.

Orzack, S. H. and E. Sober (1994a), “How (Not) to Test an Optimality Model”, Trends in Ecology and Evolution 9: 265-267.

Orzack, S. H. and E. Sober (1994b), “Optimality Models and the Test of Adaptationism”, American Naturalist 143: 361-381.


1. Here, the phrase “the debate” is a bit misleading; there is more than one debate over adaptationism, as Godfrey-Smith’s essay in this volume clarifies beautifully. More on this essay below.

2. This is not an uncontroversial definition; see, e.g., Brandon and Rausher (1996).