Addiction and Responsibility

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Jeffrey Poland and George Graham (eds.), Addiction and Responsibility, MIT Press, 2011, 306pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262015509.

Reviewed by Hanna Pickard, University of Oxford


Moral and medical models tend to polarize both theoretical and popular perspectives on addiction. The moral model views addiction as a lifestyle choice. Addicts choose a life of drugs and crime and, because they could choose otherwise, are responsible for their drug consumption and related activities, and blameworthy for harm done. The medical model views addiction as a disease. Addicts suffer from a psychiatric disorder which "hijacks" their brain and compels them to use drugs, removing any possibility of choice and control over their behaviour. They are thus not responsible for what they do or blameworthy for harm done: they need treatment, not judgement. Without exception, every paper in this excellent collection challenges this polarization and argues for a more nuanced view. Choice and control are not all-or-nothing. They come in degrees. The hard questions about addiction are how and why choice and control are impaired in addiction, and to what extent they remain intact. Correspondingly, the hard questions about responsibility concern how and why the extent of choice and control in addiction may excuse addicts from responsibility for harm, and mitigate judgements of blameworthiness. Addiction offers insight into the nature of agency and responsibility, and these in turn should inform our understanding of addiction. Anyone interested in these topics will learn from this collection. And anyone inclined to moralize or medicalize will be given pause.

As editors, Jeffrey Poland and George Graham are explicitly committed to the necessity of integrating multiple perspectives in order to make progress in our understanding of addiction. This is well reflected in the diversity of disciplines represented in the collection, including neuroscience, behavioural science, cognitive psychology, philosophy, clinical ethics, clinical research, and criminal law. The collection also contains the voices of addicts themselves, as represented by the personal stories of two philosophers who have struggled with their own addiction to food and drugs. All of the papers offer genuine and often novel contributions to our understanding of addiction and are rewarding to read. In addition, three of the papers have a claim to become standard reading for anyone working in the field. Kent Berridge and Terry Robinson have provided a clear, concise, state-of-the-art account of their theory of drug addiction as incentive sensitization and its advantages over rival neurobiological theories. Neil Levy has amassed a staggering wealth of empirical data about addiction and integrated it with a sophisticated philosophical understanding of agency and responsibility in order to offer an original theory, the ego-depletion hypothesis, for why addicts may sometimes not be responsible for consumption. And, finally, Stephen Morse offers a comprehensive and detailed analysis both of why addicts are in fact criminally responsible before the law and why the law is right to so hold them, while urging us not to allow judgements of criminal responsibility to undermine the justified sympathy and concern we may yet feel for addicted offenders.

Berridge and Robinson's theory of incentive sensitization claims that, because heavy and sustained drug consumption can have a long-term effect on dopamine transmission in brain regions associated with motivation, addicts "want" drugs to a pathological degree, especially when confronted with cues associated with past consumption. Such wants can persist even when addicts no longer like or find pleasure in the drug that they are pathologically motivated to get (for instance, when their tolerance is so great as to diminish if not extinguish the hedonic effects of use); when they are conscious of the many good reasons they have for abstaining from use (for instance, the risk of relapse and the harm to self and others that drug use can cause); and when the desire to avoid the unpleasantness of withdrawal symptoms has long abated. Incentive sensitization thus offers an explanation both of why addicts continue to use drugs despite sincere avowals that they do not enjoy using and do not (from a rational, reflective perspective) want to use, and why relapse, especially when addicts are confronted with drug cues, is always a risk. Berridge and Robinson also suggest that their theory explains why addiction is commonly understood as compulsive: it is not automatic or habitual behaviour, but, rather, behaviour that is pathologically motivated by wants directly due to neurobiological changes and so difficult to revise and control in light of preferences and reasons.

The ego-depletion hypothesis, in contrast, explains similar data by appeal to research on willpower and judgement shift. Levy rightly points out that there is a raft of good evidence that addicts are often able to recognize reasons to abstain and control their behaviour in light of these reasons. Indeed, Nancy Petry, Sheila Alessi, and Carla Rash's paper in the collection details some of the most compelling such clinical evidence. "Contingency management" treatment for addiction is both highly efficacious but, alarmingly, rarely employed in clinical settings. Such treatment is very simple: modest monetary incentives or small prizes are provided for addicts who produce clean urine samples. Typically, patients submit urine thrice weekly, with increasing value for each clean sample. The samples are tested and the reward offered immediately. Contingency management treatment radically reduces risk of disengagement from treatment and radically increases periods of abstinence compared to other standard treatments, such as counselling and behavioural therapy. Put crudely, such evidence demonstrates not only that effective treatment is often possible, but that addicts can and do choose to abstain from using if offered modest incentives and rewards.

However, Levy nonetheless argues that, despite such evidence, addicts may not be responsible for consumption. According to Levy, the reason is that, once addicted and sensitized to drug rewards and cues, addicts need substantial willpower to abstain from use when craving those rewards and exposed to those cues. Willpower, however, is a resource that can be depleted. Addicts, especially those continuously exposed to cues, must exercise it over long stretches of time, running down reserves. And low reserves, as Levy interprets the empirical data, produce a phenomenon called "judgement shift". Depleted willpower has a cognitive effect, inclining people to shift their judgement about what they most desire or have reason to do: once the shift has occurred, they do not then remind themselves of previous values and reasons for judging otherwise. Hence addicts committed to abstinence may find that they revoke this commitment if the demands on their willpower are too great. If they lack such "control over their mental life", Levy suggests, then they are not responsible for their failure to abstain.

One question for Levy's account is whether judgement shift really does entail lack of control and hence responsibility. Addicts do not literally forget their earlier commitments in face of temptation. Indeed, they know they are changing their mind, and may even know, in the moment of revision, that they shouldn't. They may not typically remind themselves of the values and reasons lying behind their previous commitment to abstain. But is it really true, as would be necessary for exculpation from responsibility, that they "lack control" and so cannot remind themselves? Certainly many standard cognitive and behavioural treatments for addiction presume that addicts can: varieties of "stop and think training" teach just that, to stop and think before acting (and, additionally, to try to get support if you can, from a family member, friend, or professional, who will help you stop and think, and also make you feel less alone).

Further, the success of contingency management treatment throws up questions for both the theory of incentive sensitization and the ego-depletion hypothesis. Addicts undergoing treatment are not in-patients. They are living in the community as usual, and so presumably are exposed to many, repeated cues. As a result, they are likely to want to use, and to need as much willpower as any addict, in treatment or not, would ever need in order to resist the temptation. They are ripe for relapse and judgement shifts. But, given only modest incentives and rewards, they abstain from use in the face of strong motivation, and, in all likelihood, weakened willpower.

The evidence from contingency management treatment thus suggests that addicts possess a degree of agency sufficient for attributions of responsibility. However, they may nonetheless have an excuse. Gideon Yaffe's paper contains an innovative development of the idea that addicts are excused from wrongdoing for reasons similar to duress: although they are agents and hence responsible when they commit criminal or wrong acts, they may nonetheless be excused because, in order not to so act, they would have to bear a burden that we do not expect people to bear. The burden Yaffe identifies addicts as having to bear is the loss of autonomy. He suggests that addicts would have to forsake their autonomy and place themselves -- their decisions, actions, fate -- in the hands of others in order to avoid some of the wrongs they commit. And, at least sometimes, they might be justified in opting to commit the wrong as opposed to bearing this loss.

The idea that addicts may be responsible but not blameworthy for some wrongs because they have an excuse is important (for development of this idea in relation to personality disorder patients, see my "Responsibility without blame: empathy and the effective treatment of personality disorder", in Philosophy, Psychiatry, Psychology, 2011, vol. 18(3)). However, the stark picture of an addict forced to choose between two alternatives -- committing wrong or losing their autonomy -- is simply not real. Addicts who are struggling with their addiction and inclined to do wrong need not place themselves entirely in the hands of others. Rather, they can ask for help, from family, friends, and professionals, to support them not to do wrong, and to encourage them to choose and act in their own and others' best interests. Needing help and support from others is not the same as losing autonomy (which, in any case, is perhaps of less than usual value, if it is being used to commit a recognized wrong one may well regret). That said, the pinpointing of a kind of duress as potentially excusing addicts is a valuable contribution. It is a staple of clinical understanding of addiction that many addicts use drugs as relief from severe psychological distress. Arguably, if addicts lack alternative coping mechanisms, they may sometimes be justified in committing certain criminal or wrong acts because we do not expect people to bear such distress without relief. Of course, the degree both of the distress experienced, and of the harm done, is highly relevant to whether or not this kind of excuse is valid in any particular instance (for further discussion of these ideas, see my "Addiction in context: philosophical lessons from a personality disorder clinic", forthcoming in Addiction and Self-control, ed. N. Levy. New York: OUP).

Why do addicts abstain when offered modest incentives and rewards? Why, for that matter, would they suffer severe psychological distress in the absence of their drug of choice? Despite the diversity of perspectives represented in the volume, one has to look hard to find a clear statement of a psycho-social understanding of addiction. It is most prominent in Morse, who suggests that we can understand why extreme deprivation and lack of opportunity might cause someone to seek the relief from the miseries of existence offered by drugs, despite the risk of poverty, poor health, and prison. Otherwise, it is in the background. In his paper on whether or not addicts have the capacity to consent to treatment given the oscillations in their values and emotions over time, Louis Charland notes the co-morbidity between addiction and other mental and physical health problems. Additionally, Nancy Nyquist Potter connects addiction to the deliberate self-harming behaviour characteristic of borderline personality disorder, a condition characterized by volatile and extreme emotions. George Ainslie intriguingly, if schematically, suggests that addicts lack autonomy because they cannot trust themselves: whatever they decide today, they cannot rely on themselves to maintain in the future, presumably because they lack a stable sense of self and lifestyle. Lastly, both philosophers who offer their own stories of addiction connect it to various of their emotions and needs. Owen Flanagan describes the way alcohol and benzodiazepines provide him with a feeling of safety, removing fear and anxiety. He also describes the extreme self-loathing that came with his addiction. Richard Garrett, in turn, describes the comfort he gets from food, and his own difficulty finding a way to love himself and others.

From a psycho-social perspective, the facts are these. Addiction is associated with: poverty; lower social, emotional, and economic functioning; childhood physical and sexual abuse; low self-esteem; a propensity for antisocial traits, anxiety, depression, and impulsivity; and other co-morbid psychiatric disorders, including psychoses and personality disorders. There are exceptions -- these are associations only. But on the whole, addicts come from troubled backgrounds of poor opportunity. Drugs offer some relief from the emotional and psychological distress such backgrounds and conditions typically create. They may also provide a culture or peer group, and the promise of social status and wealth. Whatever the effects of drugs on the brain, and whatever the limitations of willpower and judgment shift, addicts may have little incentive to abstain until new coping mechanisms have been mastered and better life prospects are genuinely available.

Bruce Alexander's infamous "Rat Park" experiment is instructive in this light. Caged, isolated rats addicted to drugs will self-administer in very high doses, foregoing food and water, sometimes to the point of death. Alexander placed morphine-addicted rats in an enclosure called "Rat Park" which was a spacious, comfortable, naturalistic setting, where rats of both sexes were able to co-habit, nest and reproduce. Rats were offered a choice between morphine-laced water and plain water. On the whole, they chose to forego the morphine and drink plain water, even when they experienced withdrawal symptoms, and even when the morphine-laced water was sweetened to significantly appeal to the rat palate. Recent studies complement Alexander's findings. Environmental enrichments protect against relapse in rats.

Addicts who ideally want to control their drug use are not offered a human version of "Rat Park". Help with housing, employment, psychiatric problems, and social community does not tend to be immediately available. The opportunities and choices available to many addicts may reasonably impede their motivation to control their use, for the alternative goods on offer are poor. What is so striking about contingency management treatment is that, given modest incentives, addicts do abstain. Presuming there is a desire to change, it seems a sliver of hope and a dash of positive reinforcement can do a lot to realise that desire.

Flanagan ends his story by saying that he gained control over his addiction by his working with others who cared for him: "the solution was social". So too is the problem. All the authors in this collection are nuanced in their account of how, why, and to what extent addicts are agents and hence responsible for their drug consumption and related behaviour. And, even if they wish to exculpate addicts for present drug consumption and related behaviour, the authors tend to hold them responsible for past decisions that led to their addiction. But ask yourself: who would I be and what choices would I make if I came from the kind of background associated with addiction? Arguably, we as a society are collectively responsible for allowing children to grow up in our midst in harrowing conditions that predispose to addiction. The hard questions about addiction lead to hard questions about us all.