Addiction and Self-Control: Perspectives from Philosophy, Psychology, and Neuroscience

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Neil Levy (ed.), Addiction and Self-Control: Perspectives from Philosophy, Psychology, and Neuroscience, Oxford University Press, 2013, 278pp., $59.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199862580.

Reviewed by Olav Gjelsvik, CSMN, University of Oslo


My grandfather died young in 1938. He was a keen smoker, teetotaller, sportsman, family man, and a pillar of society. He was definitely self-controlled in the eyes of his contemporaries -- a tremendously hard worker and, we know now, a happy addict who died from tobacco use. He had no knowledge of nicotine addiction or its ramifications.

Examples like this should be kept in mind when thinking about addiction, self-control and the relationship between the two. In his fine introduction to this new and excellent collection, Neil Levy starts by saying: "One of the defining features of addiction is an impairment of self-control: addicts are people who (to all appearance) find it especially difficult to bring their behavior into line with their best judgments" (1). There are ways of thinking about addiction, self-control and best judgment that make this statement true about my grandfather: people's best judgments need not be judgments they actually hold, but judgments they, in some sense to be specified, ought to have held; self-control should be understood from the point of view of a corresponding normative notion of the self, etc. In some (albeit very unusual) objective sense my grandfather ought to have known enough to judge his tobacco use bad, and if that had been so, he would have experienced difficulty in reducing or quitting smoking if his best judgment had been that he should quit. On the other hand, he was not in position to have such knowledge -- it simply was not available to him in his time.

Most of the volume's contributors pay little attention to the complexities raised by as simple an example as this one. The volume probably would have been even better had they done so. Addiction may be less directly tied to actual conflict with best judgment than is typically assumed; the conflict might be potential only. The relationship between best judgment, motivation and self-control needs much probing into. Furthermore, self-control is, in the literature, thought of in several different ways. Sometimes it is thought of as self-authenticity in action, acting on the strongest desire (you also endorse), sometimes it is thought of as self-autonomy, acting on the desire/judgment you (in a sense to be specified) ought to act on, and sometimes it is thought of as less demanding than any of these.

Nevertheless the collection is a very good, state-of-the-art volume. There are twelve essays, including Levy's clear and informative introductory 'Addiction and Self-Control', in which he gives a succinct overview of the field and the contributions. Some essays naturally group together. These include George Ainslie's 'Money as MacGuffin: A Factor in Gambling and Other Process Addictions', Don Ross's 'The Picoeconomics of Gambling Addiction and Supporting Neural Mechanisms', and Natalie Gold's 'Team reasoning, Framing and Self-Control: An Aristotelian Account'. They can all be seen as contributions that grow from the Picoeconomic framework developed in full by Ainslie more than twenty years ago. This framework is a general account of the human motivational system with hyperbolic discounting at its centre. It means that preferences may reverse just as a function of time passing, and the challenge is to account for dynamic stability.

Ainslie is one of the most important of all contributors to the addiction literature. Here he provides a deeply informed account of gambling behaviour, and is in as good a form as ever. He applies his framework to the case of gambling arguing that the risks of gambling "add" subjective value. This added value is in a sense the "MacGuffin"; it does not matter what it is added on to. The necessary perception of risk is, however, Ainslie claims, almost impossible to achieve without intermittent loss. The question of whether the gain is worth the loss will be very hard to answer; any answer will be seen differently from the long range and the short range perspectives available to a hyperbolic discounter. (The long-range answer bunches choices). The resulting theory is very attractive; in fact it is a theory about a whole sub-class of addictions, namely the cases where the "MacGuffin" type subjective value dominates. This class is limited to the kinds of behaviours where that sort of dominance is actually possible.

Ross contributes a very pointed and clear essay about further challenges to Ainslie's approach, in this case in particular to the effect that we need to account for the difference between someone who just gambles a lot and someone who is addicted. Ross seeks the materials for this account in neuroscience. There should be no doubt that the changes in the brain corresponding with the behaviour are important in a number of ways, and there might be findings that ground the difference between addicts and non-addicted regular users. I assume my grandfather also had changes in his brain, and that they would have been important as a ground for the difficulties he would have faced trying to stop smoking. Ross is cautious and insightful, and sees that the relations between the behavioural and the neural can be very delicate and complex.

Gold also uses the Ainsliean framework of strategic interaction between person-stages (where each stage faces a prisoner's dilemma about consuming or not). He sees the long-term interest, the bunched choice, the cooperate strategy between the person-stages, as a group action; the group being the group of person-stages. Hyperbolic discounting lends itself to this perspective. On the group perspective the hard problem of actually accounting for the cooperation in the prisoner's dilemma structure seems to evaporate. But it does lead to a new problem: we have to account for what it takes for a group to make up an agent. This is a pressing problem, one receiving a lot of attention right now. It creates further difficulty when the individuals making up the group only exist and act sequentially, in past, present, and future, and their self-interest as they exist and act is contrary to that of the group interest. I find the approach fascinating, but there are many remaining problems here.

Without solving what makes a group a group, I see close connections between the essays by Jeanette Kennett, Walter Sinnott-Armstrong, Hanna Pickard and Steve Pearce, Timothy Schroeder and Nomy Arpaly, and Gideon Yaffe. All make use of folk-psychological and moral/normative notions to enlighten important aspects of the addiction/self control issues, in conjunction with other kinds of knowledge, from other disciplines or from therapeutic practice.

Sinnott-Armstrong asks 'Are Addicts Responsible?', and concludes that the correct and good question is "How responsible are they?". Responsibility as a folk-notion is a gradual thing, and this can be shown clearly from the case of addiction, as addiction and control are also gradual, and the application-conditions for all of them are influenced by a number of pragmatic factors that vary with context. In this general picture Sinnott-Armstrong is clearly right, and it is a picture that can be extended to quite a lot of other types of mental disorders as well. There is much relevant literature about the significance of such facts, for instance, in criminal law and in social laws regulating entitlements in the welfare state, etc. The essay serves as a good entry point to the many dimensions of this discussion.

Kennett's 'Just Say No? Addictions and the Elements of Self-Control' contains a nuanced and engaging discussion of aspects of self-control that are relevant and important for understanding the relationship between addiction and self-control. She also connects this with a richly informed and humane understanding of addiction's many varieties and dimensions. She discusses Frankfurtian typologies, and provides an interesting new category in addition to the willing, unwilling and wanton addict: the resigned addict, who (possibly rightly) sees no good prospects for getting out of the situation and stops trying. In a way it is a defeated (and resigned) unwilling addict, but the concept invites further discussion: the result is a breakdown of the self that is supposed to exert control -- it might be seen as a transitional stage towards wantonness. This sort of breakdown can even be seen in extreme cases of nicotine addiction. Kennett will surely take this further.

In 'Addiction in Context. Philosophical Lessons from a Personality Disorder Clinic', Pickard and Pearce provide many insights, viewing addiction through the lens of clinical interaction with a subset of addicts. There are strong arguments against thinking of addiction as compulsion; this conclusion surely may be right even if compulsion amounts to less than the authors assume. It might be that Pickard and Pearce can be seen as making compulsion too rare. They employ mainly concepts from folk psychological understanding of mental disorder and claim these are sufficient for understanding addiction. Their link to personality disorders is helpful and insightful.

Yaffe's 'Are Addicts Akratic? Interpreting the Neuroscience of Reward' focuses on one specific mismatch between what a person values most and what (s)he does intentionally, namely the case where (s)he chooses wrongful conduct. There are several important notions at play, including valuing and valuing most, choice, intentional action and wrongful conduct. Yaffe's main conclusion is that addicts are not akratic. He reaches this result via a criticism of Timothy Schroeders's understanding of the reward system as a learning system, and an account of valuing that connects it strongly with the motivational states that actually govern action (what many others think of as desire). With this latter connection in place, akrasia might seem very difficult to achieve, even for the addict. One might however, connect valuing more with judgments and insights about what one ought to do, or at least with what Kent Berridge has called 'likings', and look for akrasia in the possible mismatch between such judgments and intentional action.

Schroeder and Arpaly focus on 'Addiction and Blameworthiness'. Part of the paper is a justification for a view quite different from Yaffe's regarding how to think about the reward system in the brain. To study both papers together is helpful. When it comes to the connection to blameworthiness, and the account of that, the authors connect blameworthiness very closely with a disjunction being true: either acting with ill will (desiring something bad) or acting with indifference (lacking a desire for the good). It seems obvious that the very notion of desire then is put under strain, and it becomes very important how one thinks about desire as a general term for all or most motivational states, or as a term for a quite specific subclass of motivations. They take the latter route, thinking of desire as a specific type of motivation. This is an interesting and challenging piece. There are many issues in need of further discussion, for instance, the relationship between the self's control of (all types of) motivations that lead to action and the kinds of blame that are legitimate.

In 'Phenomenal Authority: The Epistemic Authority of Alcoholics Anonymous', Owen Flanagan discusses with great insight both alcoholism and why AA works, on the basis of long time engagement. AA treatment works in spite of offering an episteme, an ideology, with loopholes and falsehoods. The participants understand and describe their behaviour through that episteme. That the AA episteme works, even if it contains many falsehoods, requires explanation. The explanation issues here are very tricky. Flanagan suggests that the AA episteme can be seen as containing lots of practical wisdom. I do not know the extent to which it contains the belief that their way is the only way. If so, that might help explain why it works. It makes people abstain, and that will eventually lead them to different evaluations of many activities that drinking competes with. In that case living by the episteme causes the good changes even if the episteme itself contains falsehoods (about being the only way).

Mark Walton and Nicholas Nasrallah write about 'Varieties of Valuation in the Normal and Addicted Brain: Legal and Policy Implications from a Neuroscience Perspective'. They provide a lot of valuable information and bring up a great number of issues. They see decision-making as brought about by a number of competing mechanisms, which destroys any simple picture that they see some philosophers as providing. Furthermore, they see value as having many different and, for that matter, competing properties. The richness in material is impressive and very welcome, yet the lessons to learn for law or policy are for me less clear, partly because the picture becomes so rich. One reason for this is that, while it is right to do as they do and focus on how the normal brain works, this needs integration with a good account of how a healthy mind works, and a good account of how a healthy mind works needs to bring the many dimensions into a coherent whole with fairly few dimensions. How vulnerable is the healthy mind so understood to surrounding danger, as opposed to the vulnerability of some of the underlying mechanisms to such dangers?

Richard Holton and Kent Berridge's 'Addiction between Compulsion and Choice' is in my view the highlight of this collection. They use first hand knowledge of the neuroscience of addiction in a fruitful and penetrating engagement with philosophy. Berridge's work on 'Wanting' and 'Liking' is reasonably well known among many philosophers, as is Holton's. As collaborators, their work here is even better. They review the latest relevant neuroscientific evidence and argue that there are two basic sorts of desires, dispositional and occurrent. They interpret this finding, criticise many rival approaches to what the dopamine system does, explain what they take it to do, and provide a model for what happens in addiction, a model that shows how addiction exhibits compulsion-like properties while remaining a choice of sorts. In my view they make real and very significant progress, especially in explaining how it can be that addiction exhibits properties both of choice and compulsion. I think the approach can be understood and applied so as to cover even the case of my grandfather. (The conflict between wanting and liking can in the right context remain dormant.) The essay also contains a lot of important information for everyone working on a general theory of motivation. To my mind the authors should develop their theory more. They should, in particular, say more about how they think about the self that is doing the control in self-control and how this control works, including the role of beliefs, judgments and knowledge about what is of value, and how those things relate and should relate to desires. In any case, this is very good stuff. It is a worthy rival to the Picoeconomic approach.

Levy has done a good job putting this volume together and writing a very informative introduction. The merits of the individual essays do vary somewhat, as they always do, but the merits of the whole are undisputable.