Addiction and Weakness of Will

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Lubomira Radoilska, Addiction and Weakness of Will, Oxford University Press2013148pp., $59.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199641963.

Reviewed by Neil Levy, Florey Institute of Neuroscience and Mental Health/Oxford Centre for Neuroethics


This book is published in Oxford University Press's International Perspectives in Philosophy and Psychiatry series, which may lead the reader to expect it to be concerned with addiction as a psychiatric problem and to engage with the large body of clinical and empirical work on the topic. That expectation would be disappointed: Lubomira Radoilska is interested in addiction only insofar as it serves to illustrate problems arising when agents fail to act as they judge they ought. Indeed, there is relatively little discussion of addiction in the book, and when it does appear it is in the guise of literary accounts, which almost certainly depart significantly from the reality of addiction as experienced by most sufferers. The book is not a contribution to the literature on the philosophy of psychiatry or to the literature on addiction. Instead, it is a dense and serious exploration of foundational issues in moral psychology, with an eye most especially on the conditions under which agents are morally responsible for akratic behavior.

Radoilska holds that getting responsibility for akrasia right requires a fully developed account of moral responsibility more generally. She develops her own account by working through and criticizing the views of other philosophers. She begins with accounts that emphasize control, focusing on R. Jay Wallace's view, before devoting two chapters to views that do not make control central. The first of these chapters discusses Angela Smith's rational relations view, and the second, Nomy Arpaly's quality of will account. The fourth chapter is also critical, focusing on Richard Holton's account of weakness of the will. Finally, in chapter five Radoilska puts forward her own alternative.

Given the brevity of the book, I think this structure was not well chosen. Radoilska's own view deserves a far more extended discussion than she can give here. Indeed, each of the views she criticizes deserves lengthier treatment than it gets. Though her criticisms are often penetrating, a reader familiar with the views will be able to construct possible replies on behalf of each. One would have liked to hear what Radoilska would have to say to these replies.

The first chapter, as already mentioned, focuses on control-based accounts of moral responsibility. Radoilska has two main criticisms of such accounts. First, she holds, they cannot explain why we are disposed to hold agents responsible for their attitudes, and not just their actions (given that they lack 'voluntary control' over their attitudes), and these accounts are unacceptably 'metaphysical'. It is not clear what she means by this latter claim. When she first introduces the criticism she seems to mean that (whether or not they recognize this fact) control-based accounts require that the agent have the power to do otherwise in some libertarian sense, but in a footnote she accuses John Martin Fischer's guidance control of the same sin, though she recognizes that it does not require any such power.

That footnote is in fact the only mention of Fischer in the entire book. That's disappointing, because it appears that the view associated with him has the resources to rebut both of Radoilska's criticisms. While she is certainly right that emotions and propositional attitudes are typically not under what she calls 'voluntary control', control-based views like Fischer's are built on something much less demanding than that: moderate reasons-responsiveness. Attitudes often are appropriately reasons-responsive. The fact that the agent lacks the capacity to alter her anger or jealousy, say, may not preclude responsibility for these states on a control-based account, since the relevant mechanisms may be capable of detecting and reacting to reasons appropriately. The suspicion arises that Radoilska has stacked the decks by assuming that these accounts require a very demanding kind of control; at least some views demand much less.

Chapter 2 is concerned with Smith's view. Radoilska argues that whereas control-based accounts don't account for our responsibility for actions, Smith's view (like Arpaly's) doesn't recognize the genuine importance of control. It is the fact that phobias are out of the agent's control but other attitudes are not that explains why we hold people responsible for the latter. Further, Radoilska claims that Smith's rational relations view cannot explain why agents are responsible for actions that are not rationally linked to their evaluative stance. Again, Smith seems to have replies available. For her it is the judgment-dependence of attitudes that matters, not whether they are actually rationally linked to agents' evaluative stance or whether they are controlled. Radoilska also suggests that we hold agents responsible for the very conflict of attitudes in some cases of irrationality, but Smith can only hold agents responsible for each conflicting attitude in such cases. It might be replied that holding agents responsible for each conflicting attitudes is a way of holding them responsible for the conflict.

Chapter 3 focuses on Arpaly's account of inverse akrasia, which occurs (Arpaly claims) when an agent akratically does what she actually has most reason to do. Working through some of Arpaly's examples, Radoilska claims that the agents actually recognize the reasons for which they act as good reasons. Her case is persuasive, but the problem might simply arise from the details of the examples. Perhaps other examples might have shown that agents might be (intuitively) praiseworthy for actions the reasons in favor of which they were unaware. Radoilska has a second line of criticism that, if successful, would block this possibility. She claims that because she assumes that agential control is irrelevant to action, Arpaly is unable to explain what makes an akratic action an action at all. So far as I can tell, however, Arpaly does not need to maintain that agential control cannot be invoked to explain what makes an action an action; she needs only to maintain that control over certain facts is not (always) relevant to responsibility for these facts.

Chapter 4 focuses on Holton's view, which shares with Arpaly a commitment to maintaining that agents may act akratically and yet rightly. Holton distinguishes between akrasia and weakness of the will. The first is action against one's better judgment; the second is unreasonable revision of a resolution. For Holton this opens up the possibility of an agent weakly acting in a way that accords with their best judgment. Once again Radoilska focuses on examples to show that Holton's weakness of will does not involve unreasonable revision of a resolution; rather, it is revision for good reasons. For her argument to generalize, it would have to be true that when agents do the right thing intentionally, they are always aware of their reasons for doing so, under an appropriate description. Holton and Arpaly would invoke considerations from psychology to deny that this is the case.

Radoilska then develops her alternative conception of akrasia. On her view, akrasia is 'pre-intentional': it does not involve fully intentional agency because it involves acting like a 'mere purposive agent' who responds only to what is immediately present. What Holton calls weakness of the will is a secondary failure of agency: it involves a failure to tackle the problem arising (due to an agent's evaluative immaturity) from her disposition to be swayed by immediately present (merely) apparent goods.

Finally, chapter 5 develops a unified account of moral responsibility, incorporating a recognition of the factors that motivate both control-based views and non-volitional alternatives. It builds on an Aristotelian notion of action as actualization. A successful action produces what it aims at -- as volitional accounts rightly emphasize -- but also actualizes the agent herself (the focus of non-volitional views). The actualization view emphasizes a kind of control that is supposed to be more fundamental than that focused on by volitional views, and a kind of rational agency that is distinctively human: the agency whereby we make ourselves a historically situated human being with a character of our own.

On the actualization view of action, acting essentially involves intending, and intending is acting under the guise of the good. Judging something as good is constitutively involved in trying to bring about something. Akratic actions -- and, allegedly, addiction -- involves success at bringing something about combined with failure to aim at what the agent truly values. It is this fact that makes it so normatively puzzling but also what makes it apt for moral responsibility. Akrasia arises from evaluative immaturity; for the evaluatively mature agent, the conflict that the agent's resolutions fail to defeat would not arise in the first place.

It is very difficult to assess the actualization view. Radoilska's presentation of it is too compressed for the reader to have a clear idea of its similarities to and differences from other views. I am unclear how much of the view presented Smith (for example) must take issue with. The final chapter suffers most from the flaw that affects the whole book: its difficult and dense arguments and claims are presented all too quickly, without much elaboration. Indeed, there is no clear canonical statement of the actualization view at all.

Specialists in moral responsibility and moral psychology will benefit considerably from reading Radoilska's view, especially her sustained criticisms of accounts that currently dominate the landscape. If it is a sign of success that a book leaves the reader wanting more, then Addiction and Weakness of Will is a spectacular success: it leaves the reader anxiously awaiting a full statement of Radoilska's alternative view. On the evidence of the intelligence displayed in this book, it will be worth the wait.