Addressing Levinas

Placeholder book cover

Eric Sean Nelson, Antje Kapust, and Kent Still (eds.), Addressing Levinas, Northwestern University Press, 2005, 331 pp, $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0810120488.

Reviewed by Martin Kavka, Florida State University


After what seemed to be an infinite delay, Northwestern University Press has finally published partial proceedings of the "Addressing Levinas" conference held at Emory University in the fall of 1999. (In the meantime, the excellent essays in this volume by Claire Katz and Tina Chanter have appeared in expanded form in their own recent books.) Addressing Levinas provides an opportunity to survey the field of Levinas studies in Continental-philosophy circles at that time. While at the beginning of that decade, there was somewhat of an allergy to readings of Levinas as a philosopher of religion or as a Jewish thinker, this volume shows none of that. For that the editors are to be praised, although one might have hoped that they could at least have developed an index or even also an index locorum to the contributors' citations of Levinas. The breadth of the contributors' topics is impressive; not only philosophy of religion and Jewish thought, but also straight-up phenomenology, trauma theory, feminist theory, and psychoanalysis are included. But there is also a basic confusion in the essays over the arguments that Levinas is making and the claims that Levinas entitles us to make. As a result, despite the inclusion of some excellent essays, the volume as a whole may not bring much insight to the reader. Unfortunately, given limitations of space, I can only point to this through all-too-brief accounts of a few of the essays in the volume.

The problem surfaces in the first of the essays, Jill Robbins's "Strange Fire." On one level, it is a helpful gloss of the epigraph to the first section of Levinas's 1963 collection of essays Difficult Freedom, which is a quotation from a commentary on Leviticus 10:2 by the eleventh-century exegete Rashi, "Let them not enter the sanctuary drunk." Rashi is here giving a reason why God struck down Aaron's sons Nadab and Abihu for their offering of "strange fire." On the one hand, Robbins argues that Levinas is endorsing Rashi's theodicy: because "Levinas's Judaism is intellectualist, not emotional" (14), theories of religion that rest on a religious or mystical feeling akin to the drunkenness of Aaron's sons are to be rejected. But Robbins also wants to argue that the Biblical account "reverberates most in a Levinasian way" (14) when it mentions Aaron's silence in response to his sons' death. Here, she is not recommending theodicy, but an antitheodic move that refuses to speak in the face of trauma. The editors claim that Robbins is here being "subtle and understated" (xxv), but some readers will see the gap between her "Levinasian" view and her claims about Levinas's own view and scratch their heads. What is the difference between Levinas's own claims and a "Levinasian" argument? What is the criterion by which a claim can be called "Levinasian" even when Levinas himself says something at odds with that claim? What authorizes readers of Levinas to be "Levinasian," and neither just mere repeaters of Levinas nor opponents of Levinas?

Robbins does not answer these questions, and neither do any of the other contributors. Robert Bernasconi, in "Levinas and the Struggle for Existence," a valuable essay that carefully draws out the aporiai inherent in Levinasian political philosophy, comes closest when he asks "if it is legitimate to hold Levinas to the standards that he himself imposes on other philosophers" (180). While Bernasconi appears to assume that the answer to the question is affirmative, such a conclusion might be too hasty. Once we follow Bernasconi and see the philosophical gaps opened by Levinas's Eurocentrism and his inattention to the institutions of civil society, can we engage in sociopolitical acts as "Levinasians"? If so, how? If not, what is the point of holding Levinas to any standards at all? Why not just read someone else?

For it is clear that Levinasian ethics can be critiqued for being as empty as Hegel thought Kantian morality to be. After unpacking the phenomenon of being faced by another, in language that exceeds even the high standards of writing set by his past work, Alphonso Lingis closes his essay in Addressing Levinas, "Bare Humanity," with a brief account of a poor Brazilian prostitute in São Paulo. Levinas's phenomenology of the face can explain how "she, who did not need you or want you, got born in you" (108). But the result of this obsession is not, as readers unaware of Lingis's writings might initially suspect, simply feeding the woman to ensure that she does not starve; a waiter whom Lingis sees feeding her is described as "not looking at her, not speaking to her" (107), in other words as abjuring the personalism that Lingis finds in Levinas. Neither does the phenomenology of the face lead to, say, one's organizing protests against the sex tourism that would make it possible to have that particular encounter of being faced. Instead, the phenomenon of being faced by a prostitute is what makes the act of hiring a prostitute possible: "You [in whom the prostitute was born] who after all have so much tenderness and tact, kisses and caresses to squander" (108). When Levinas can be invoked to support such objectification of others -- the reduction of another person's identity to his or her kissability -- something has gone seriously awry. But even more seriously, there seems to be little recourse in Levinas by which philosophers could distinguish between good and bad Levinasians. On one hand, Levinas is clear that the other person is not given in the face-to-face encounter, since if the other person is given to my knowledge, s/he is no longer other. And so once I become obsessed by another's radical exteriority, there seems to be no way to think about the other person as more than a bare site -- or, to invoke the pun in Lingis's title, bare flesh -- upon which I can project my own desires and fantasies. On the other hand, Levinas is equally clear that what is given in the face-to-face encounter is the fact of another's independent expression, or self-attestation, as the precondition of propositional discourse. In that case, the coherence of my response to another with his or her speech might serve as a standard by which one could judge between good and bad ethical acts. But Levinas does not help us decide between these two options.

This is the major issue that arises when reading Levinas. Is Levinas telling us what actually happens in an interpersonal encounter, or telling us what needs to be the case for conversation to take place? This lack of clarity has been noted in the scholarship for almost two decades, since Robert Bernasconi introduced the distinction between the empirical and transcendental readings of Levinas in the 1989 article "Rereading Totality and Infinity." The empirical reading of Levinas -- one to which Lingis seems to subscribe, and which looms over any scholar as soon as she or he decides to think through the thickets of a Levinasian political philosophy (as Bernasconi and John Drabinski do in this volume) -- assumes that a face-to-face encounter is a concrete one, and that one can develop a gradation of better and worse concrete responses to another's self-attestation. The transcendental reading of Levinas, or at least of his the 1961 book Totality and Infinity, argues that Levinas's phenomenological method shows that "there is no ethics without ontology" (as Bernasconi writes at "Struggle" 177 ); the face's self-attestation thus becomes the condition of the possibility of experience.[1]

The transcendental reading of Levinas is strengthened by the inability of the empirical reading to explain how the face can be an object of experience and still transcend consciousness. But even its most ardent supporters limit it to Totality and Infinity; for example, Theodore de Boer describes Levinas's later work, such as the 1974 Otherwise than Being, or Beyond Essence, as departures from this transcendental method.[2] However, the reticence to extend this reading has been a little puzzling, in part because the arguments of Otherwise than Being and other later essays are deeply dependent on Husserlian transcendental phenomenology. For this reason, Leslie MacAvoy's "The Other Side of Intentionality" is to be applauded; it is one of the first essays on Levinas to recognize this. The best and most important essay in Addressing Levinas, MacAvoy's "Other Side" carefully reconstructs the arguments in Levinas's later work for sensibility as the condition for the possibility of experience and for the "nonintentional subjectivity" (114) that can engage in acts of substituting itself for another. MacAvoy shows that a close reading of Husserl's lectures on internal time-consciousness can open up phenomenology in ways that are decidedly non-Husserlian, yet still phenomenological and transcendental in method. MacAvoy provides a way for Levinas scholars to disentangle the debates about Levinasian phenomenology from the debates about Levinas's relationship to Husserl and Heidegger, debates which far too often engage in name-calling at the expense of actual philosophizing. Similarly, Diane Perpich's "Sensible Subjects: Levinas and Irigaray on Incarnation and Ethics" (296–309), uses the argument that sensibility is the condition for ethics to the wonderful effect of reading Irigaray as a Levinasian, as opposed to the standard reading of her as a critic of Levinas. (As an aside, it is notable that the essays by women in this volume are on average superior to those by men, and that the essays by junior scholars are on average superior to those by senior scholars.)

The essays that strengthen the transcendental reading of Levinas are important ones because they show that critics of Levinas gain the greater part of their power from stereotypes that are due to the empirical reading. François Raffoul, in "Being and the Other: Ethics and Ontology in Levinas and Heidegger," assumes that Levinas is offering a concrete ethic that is opposed to the concrete ethic that Heidegger is offering in Being and Time. And while there are Levinasian texts that support this view, they have no falsifying power over the transcendental reading, which would claim that Levinasian phenomenology explains how a Heideggerean ethos is possible, and in that explanation, gives richer contours to a phenomenological ethic than those found, say, in "The Question Concerning Technology."

David Wood, in "Some Questions for My Levinasian Friends" -- perhaps the single most potent critique of Levinas published -- seeks to dismiss the Levinasian account of subjectivity as infinite obligation by claiming that ethics cannot be separated from ontology, in part because "how we understand the other is essential to our capacity to honor, respect, and protect them" (156), and in part because the origin of obligation in the interpersonal realm rests on an implicit humanism that depends upon a certain ontology that, among other things, cannot ground ethical acts toward animals. One could reply to Wood that the transcendental reading of Levinas serves only to ground the possibility of ethics; as such, it cannot say anything in advance about which non-maleficent acts are more or less ethical than others. In other words, debates about whether Levinas supports vegetarianism would miss the point of Levinas's phenomenological method. But Wood would then make the further claim that it becomes impossible to defend the priority of ethics on the transcendental reading; such a reading is incoherent "because the motivation and formulation of this ethical opening rests on the ontological formulations that it then supersedes" (158). But Wood's claim does not pack the powerful punch that he believes it does. After all, the mutual dependence of freedom and the moral law in Kant's Critique of Practical Reason has a similar structure: freedom is the condition of the moral law in ordo cognoscendi while the moral law is the condition of freedom in ordo essendi. Taking this as a model, where does the incoherence lie in reading Levinas as a thinker who, through phenomenological analyses of various structures, discovers the ability to find oneself obliged as a "fact of reason" that has its ground in the primacy of the ethical which precedes ontology? In this way, the obligations of, say, maternity would be the ground of ethics in ordo cognoscendi, while ethics would be the ground of maternity in ordo essendi. Further examination of such an account may indeed show that it falls into insurmountable problems; it might be an example of the incoherence that Stanley Rosen has diagnosed in both the Enlightenment and postmodernism in Hermeneutics as Politics.[3] But such judgments are still in the offing; Wood's critique of Levinas must be extended to the sphere of Levinas's method. To make it in terms of Levinas's lack of coherence with moral instincts, as Wood does, is to deprive it of teeth.

Arguments for the strength of the transcendental reading of Levinas, however, will surely disappoint certain readers of Levinas who want to see in his philosophy a recipe for making the world a better place. Antje Kapust, for example, in "Returning Violence" seeks to show that Levinas argues that we are not duped by the recurrence of violence and that a "self-perception of oneself as an ethical performance … could create a non-inert peace beyond violence" (250). However, while it is the case that Levinas shows that we are not duped by the recurrence of violence, there seems to be little evidence in Levinasian texts for a view that a self, or even a community, could create peace directly. The arguments of Levinas's early works such as Existence and Existents, Time and the Other, and Totality and Infinity aim to show only that salvation or messianic triumph is really possible, not that I can produce such ends directly through my ethical acts. (In Totality and Infinity, what I can produce through my ethical acts is only more time for the Messiah to come.) The arguments of Otherwise than Being aim to show that all that ethics can produce is an eternal cycle of skepticism and its refutation, a constant critique of institutions in the name of what they purport to represent. There are good reasons to see Levinas as having a deflationary view of his own thought.

Following the threads of the transcendental reading given new life by MacAvoy and Perpich, one can conclude that what makes one a Levinasian is an adherence to a phenomenological method that demonstrates that ethical acts and redemption are really possible. Levinas's various phenomenological arguments give confidence that we are not doomed to a Hobbesian state of nature; this is what makes him deserving of a place in the canon of 20th-century Continental philosophy. But phenomenology cannot guarantee that the end of justice at which other-centered acts aim will take place anytime soon, or perhaps even within history. Like everyone else, Levinasians will get it wrong -- perhaps in the case of animals, or transgendered persons, or Palestinians, who are so often elided from the calls for, and the acts intended to produce, justice. In addition, as Bernasconi shows, they may get it wrong about the West, or about the role of institutions in civil society. But Levinasians can only see if they are wrong by surveying the results of acts and by attending to others' skeptical responses, in order to discover if their acts have worked satisfactorily or if others have challenged their claims of entitlement to various practical commitments. In other words, if Levinasians want to defend (or refute) arguments such as Robbins's that her response to the deaths of Aaron's sons is more Levinasian than Levinas's own -- or any arguments about the set of claims that can be labelled "Levinasian" -- they will have to engage in more basic tasks of philosophical analysis. In the process, they may find that they have become pragmatists.

[1] Robert Bernasconi, "Rereading Totality and Infinity," in Charles E. Scott and Arleen Dallery, eds. The Question of the Other: Essays in Contemporary Continental Philosophy (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1989). See also Diane Perpich's helpful analysis of the distinction in "The Structure and Justification of Infinite Responsibility in the Philosophy of Emmanuel Levinas" (Ph.D. diss., University of Chicago, 1997), 196-225.

[2] Theodore de Boer, "The Rationality of Levinas's Philosophy," in The Rationality of Transcendence: Studies in the Philosophy of Emmanuel Levinas (Amsterdam: J. C. Gieben, 1997), 65f.

[3] Stanley Rosen, Hermeneutics as Politics (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1987), 19-49. My thanks to Leora Batnitzky for the suggestion that Rosen might be helpful in evaluating Levinas's thought.