Adoration and Annihilation: The Convent Philosophy of Port-Royal

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John J. Conley, S.J., Adoration and Annihilation: The Convent Philosophy of Port-Royal, U of Notre Dame Press, 2009, 317pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780268022969.

Reviewed by Elizabeth Rapley, University of Ottawa



The purpose of this book is made clear in its opening pages: to retrieve what the author calls “a major variant of baroque Augustinian philosophy” from its long-term invisibility. His source-material is the writings of three distinguished abbesses of the seventeenth century: Angélique Arnauld (d. 1661), her sister Agnès (d. 1671), and their niece, Angélique de Saint-Jean Arnauld d’Andilly (d. 1684), all abbesses of the doomed monastery of Port-Royal. Embedded within a massive collection of recorded material — letters of spiritual counsel, devotional tracts, conferences with their nuns — he discerns a philosophy that is unique, not only because of its gendered specificity, but because it had a unique context: the travails of a religious community living at a certain time, under conditions of extreme stress.

Port-Royal, the convent that became famous as the flagship of Jansenism in Louis XIV’s France, knew only a century of life between the year that Angélique Arnauld imposed Cistercian reform on an ancient and derelict monastery (1609), and the day in 1709 when, by royal order, its nuns were expelled and its buildings razed to the ground. Its fall from grace (the king’s grace, and that of the Church) was the end result of a growing dichotomy between two movements in the Catholic Reformation. The young Mère Angélique’s reforms initially earned her the praise and support of the Parisian elites. But her adherence to the teachings, first of the Oratorians Bérulle and Condren, then of Saint-Cyran, placed her community firmly in the Augustinian school of spirituality: at odds, therefore, with the more humanist doctrine then being taught and preached by the Jesuits. Throughout the rest of the seventeenth century, the two great schools of religious thought confronted each other with growing animosity. In a time when the religious and the political were inextricably fused together, such a confrontation could only end with the defeat of one or other party by political means. Even before Angélique’s death, the writing was on the wall for her convent. In the years that followed, as persecution increased, abated for a while, and then increased again, the mood in the community became, more and more, one of victimhood.

It is in this context that John Conley introduces us to the philosophy of Port-Royal as developed by the three abbesses. As he points out, their philosophy has hitherto gone unnoticed because it was always wrapped inside their theology, and therefore, for thinkers on the outside, difficult to unpack. It does not help that they were women in a field dominated by men, or that they were, ultimately, the losers in a great doctrinal battle. By means of a careful analysis of their writings (which are extensively quoted in this book), he makes the case that their search for the divine was interlaced with the consideration of the essentially human problems of moral behavior, above all those that they saw within their monastery walls.

The abbesses’ primary concern was theological: who God is, and how He must be adored and served. As they saw it, the facile attribution of human characteristics to God is wrong, and indeed blasphemous. God is unknowable, and His purposes are inscrutable. The best that man (by which of course the abbesses principally meant woman) can do is to adore Him, to try as best she can to lose herself in Him. That is what is meant by “annihilation”, and it can only be achieved through contemplation. Toward that end the community instituted the practice of perpetual adoration of the Blessed Sacrament, not previously a tradition in Cistercian monasticism.

From that theological starting point there was developed, of necessity, an anthropology, concerning the nature of man and how he relates to God and to life on this earth. Port-Royal adhered to the Jansenist doctrine that humankind, since the Fall, is totally corrupt and helpless. There is no such thing as natural virtue. Justice, temperance, fortitude, wisdom — these cardinal virtues, considered by Christian humanists to be inherent in man’s nature — are nothing more than façades for the all-pervasive sin of pride. Every action, to have merit, must originate in and be suffused by the grace that only God can give. Self-regard of any kind is an obstacle to true virtue. The more the soul is annihilated and absorbed into God, the holier it will become. Outward behavior means nothing if the interior disposition is lacking. It follows from this that sacraments can be effective only when the soul is properly prepared, and in a state of true repentance. As Conley shows us, it was a steely code of morality that showed not the slightest sympathy for the weakness of fallen humanity. The unavoidable conclusion was that the gate is indeed narrow, and that few of God’s creatures will enter the Kingdom of Heaven.

Conley emphasizes the gendered — and conventual — quality of the Arnauld abbesses’ teaching. There was little that was universal about it. Their focus was on women, above all the women of the convent for whom they were responsible. The virtues that their moral philosophy privileged were the monastic virtues of poverty and obedience, of silence and of humility, the humility that allows the creature to know her nothingness within the immensity of God. Their practical purpose was to mark out the path to religious perfection within the parameters of the monastic community.

Interestingly, women’s rights was a topic on which they were uncommonly assertive. The community of Port-Royal had won the privilege — rare in those days — of electing its own abbesses and choosing its own chaplains and confessors. This allowed a succession of abbesses to claim an unprecedented degree of autonomy in the community’s governance. They further claimed a personal autonomy for the women they admitted into their cloister who, they insisted (in contradiction to common practice), must be allowed to choose their vocation freely, without pressure from family or convent. Furthermore their nuns were not enjoined, as were many others in their day, to make ignorance into a virtue; rather, they were exposed to a biblical, patristic culture, and they were encouraged in community conferences to discuss and explore the issues that concerned them. The corollary to this was that the women of Port-Royal were expected to have an independent moral conscience, to do what was right and oppose what was wrong.

The full implications of this moral independence became clear when the community found itself in trouble with the establishment. Port-Royal was no ivory tower. Its proud espousal of the teachings of Saint-Cyran and Jansen brought down upon it the wrath of the civil and ecclesiastical authorities — the bishops, the king, the pope. The women were commanded, one by one, to sign submissions to outside authority. What should be their course? As the situation grew more tense its abbesses had to develop practical guidelines of behavior for a community under siege. How should nuns, vowed as they were to obedience, respond to commands that they believed to be evil? With careful parsing, or with outright defiance? How were they to defend themselves if they were exiled to other convents? With argument, or with a wall of silence?

This book, Adoration and Annihilation, is about philosophy, and about philosophy as it is intimately connected to history. Its principal readership will be students of philosophy, and for them Conley points out how various themes in the abbesses’ thought do, in fact, resonate in later schools of philosophy. But for many readers, myself included, the overwhelming impression that it will leave is one of strangeness. This feminine expression of Jansenism was a tree that bloomed within Christianity at a certain time and in a certain place, and though it produced some long-lasting fruit, it has been left so far behind by later developments that modern Catholics will find it barely recognizable. That does not make it insignificant. John Conley deserves our thanks for bringing it to light, arguing for its depth and gravitas, and claiming a place for it in the canon of modern philosophy.