Adorno and Existence

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Peter E. Gordon, Adorno and Existence, Harvard University Press, 2016, 256pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674734784.

Reviewed by Christian Skirke, University of Amsterdam


Peter Gordon addresses a much-neglected topic in the complex intellectual history of the Frankfurt School. He traces Adorno's lifelong engagement with existentialism and concludes that Adorno owes more to existentialism than usually meets the eye. What underlies Adorno's sustained critique of this philosophical tradition, Gordon claims, is the fact that Adorno utilizes existentialism and its radical conception of subjectivity as a foil to develop his own materialism.

The book takes us chronologically through Adorno's various treatments of existentialism and phenomenology. It starts with his early critique of Kierkegaard as a bourgeois thinker in Kierkegaard: Construction of the Aesthetic (1933). It addresses his objections to Husserl's transcendental phenomenology from the manuscripts of the mid-1930s, the material published in abridged form as Against Epistemology: A Metacritique (1956). Then, Gordon examines Adorno's polemics against Heidegger and his existentialist followers in The Jargon of Authenticity (1964), discusses the more nuanced perspective of Negative Dialectics (1966), and looks at Kierkegaardian affinities in Adorno's writings from the 1950s and 1960s. The book ends with a synthesis according to which Adorno's mature philosophical position is the product of a thoroughgoing dialectical exchange with existentialism.

The recurrent theme throughout Gordon's detailed reconstruction of this exchange is that Adorno understood existentialism as an unsuccessful attempt to break away from what he identified as bourgeois interiority (pp. 6-7). Echoing Marx and Engels, Adorno takes bourgeois interiority to be the broader intellectual tendency behind various forms of idealism, that is, the tendency to premise one's conception of the historical world on the ahistorical inner life of an isolated subject. As the German Ideology pointed out with respect to Kant and the Young Hegelians, this is an ideological move that typically leaves underlying patterns of domination unacknowledged.

Adorno extended this verdict to Kierkegaard, Husserl, Heidegger, and existentialist thought in general. Gordon recounts that, according to Adorno, Kierkegaard remains attached to bourgeois interiority because what distinguishes his moral agent from the aesthete is a further deepening of the subject rather than a break with the bourgeois fa├žade. Husserl's conception of intentionality retains bourgeois traits because of its solipsistic setup, brought into sharp relief by Husserl's method of transcendental reduction and his aprioristic treatment of consciousness and experience. Heidegger's early philosophy is deeply problematic in this respect because, privileging the first-personal character of the subject in terms of mineness and authenticity, his ontology leaves no room for fundamental ontological resistance to the all-consuming activity of the subject.

As to existentialism broadly conceived, Gordon contends along with Adorno that its concern with authentic choices testifies to its ideological entanglement. Authentic choices are meant to result in self-determined subjectivity, yet existentialist self-determination has no determinate point of reference outside the subject. Therefore, ultimately, as Gordon reminds us, authentic choices generate no friction for subjectivity even if they go against what a dialectical materialist would recognize as the subject's own nature (p. 67). Adorno takes this to show that existentialism, instead of allowing agents to shake off the fetters of domination, tightens them and thus is regressive.

Yet, Gordon insists that Adorno's verdict has to be understood in a qualified way. He argues that, rather than simply discarding existentialism, Adorno sublates its aprioristic accounts of subjectivity, agency, or consciousness into his own materialist a priori, the priority of the object (pp. 127-9). Adorno's notion of the priority of the object says, roughly, that while subjects always have objective traits, objects ultimately have no subjective traits. This notion is central to his thesis that objects cannot be fully absorbed, incorporated, conceptualized or identified by subjects without leaving a remainder that he calls non-identical. And this thesis looks incompatible with central tenets of phenomenology and existentialism such as the self-sufficient character of consciousness or the ontological freedom of agents. Gordon explains, however, that Adorno's notion of the priority of the object emerges out of an attempt to preserve what he found valuable about existentialism, especially in its phenomenological form: 'materialism properly conceived actually incorporates the truth of idealism, and this means that, precisely from the perspective of the subject, it must radicalize the notion of the object's resistance to subjectivity' (pp. 165-6). Specifically, Gordon's Adorno appreciated the existentialist and phenomenological commitment to unbiased accounting for contentful experiences, a commitment that bespeaks the impulse to detotalize subjectivity and thus to emancipate it from metaphysical strictures. Existentialism failed, according to Adorno, because it tried to realize this goal by removing obstacles to the subject's self-realization and thus ended up boosting underlying domination patterns (p. 69). To break this double bind, Adorno insisted that, in realizing themselves, subjects have to acknowledge that there are irreducible aspects of the objective, including their own natures, which do not reduce to subjective structures.

Gordon's reconstruction is comprehensive and meticulous; his presentation even of Adorno's most convoluted philosophical claims is elegant and interwoven seamlessly with wider socio-political and contextual considerations. What asks for some critical comment, however, is the fact that he leaves Adorno's assessment of existentialism and phenomenology completely intact. This seems to be a conscious decision, as several disclaimers early on in the book indicate. Gordon describes his goal as 'limited to understanding Adorno's own intellectual development with a specific focus on his confrontation with those various forms of existential phenomenology and fundamental ontology that played such a powerful role in twentieth-century thought on the European Continent' (p. 7). And he adds an even stronger disclaimer: 'It is an acknowledged limitation of this present book that it confines itself to Adorno's own perspective' (p. 6). Effectively, this means that Gordon leaves aside aspects of existentialism and phenomenology that Adorno ignores, overlooks or misrepresents, let alone more recent developments in phenomenological scholarship that could challenge Adorno's view of the entire tradition. Given the overall textual erudition of the book, this looks like a missed opportunity. In the last instance, Gordon's internal perspective on Adorno's engagements with existentialism impairs his 'critical purpose . . . to offer a reading that elucidates Adorno's own philosophical argumentation in such a way as to lend those arguments renewed force' (p. 10).

For example, Gordon recalls at various points that Adorno's objections to existentialism are in essence objections to identity thinking. In Adorno's lexicon, identity thinking is a common feature of philosophies that suppress the non-identical. According to Adorno, existentialism falls under this rubric because its subject-centered ontology entails that the scope of the world is circumscribed by subjective capacities for disclosing and appropriating it. As a consequence, the non-identical is ruled out from the world. It is worth asking, however, whether existentialism is restrictive in this way. Adorno places existentialism under the category of identity thinking because of existentialist appeals to authenticity and mineness. There are reasons to believe that this standpoint is questionable.

Mineness stands for the selfhood of the subject. Heidegger introduced this intuitive concept in Being and Time where mineness has an especially strong sense. He characterized the subject as "in each case mine" because he saw Dasein as a fully individuated first-personal agent. Much weaker senses of mineness have been proposed in the literature since Heidegger. Recently, Dan Zahavi has argued for a pre-personal conception of mineness as the minimal selfhood necessary for any coherent experience. Historically, existentialists have brought far more radical positions to the table. The early Sartre experimented with a no-self account of subjectivity according to which mineness is just a second-order concept. Even in Being and Nothingness, after having abandoned this radical perspective, Sartre did not think that personhood, or mineness in Heidegger's strong sense, is a feature of basic subjectivity; he linked personhood specifically to the objectification of the subject from an external standpoint.

Although he defers to David Sherman's work on Adorno and Sartre for nuance, Gordon merely reports Adorno's dismissal of Sartre's philosophy as an epigonic offshoot of Heidegger's views (pp. 109, 139-42). A more considered perspective might have suggested that Adorno could have had philosophical reasons to sympathize with core aspects of Sartre's existentialism.

In Being and Nothingness Sartre proposes an ontological conception of the subject according to which it is a contingent modification of being as such. In contrast to everything (being-in-itself) that is governed by the identity principle, the subject (being-for-itself) is nothing and is not governed by the identity principle. This point about subjectivity is first directed against idealism, in both its phenomenalist and phenomenological guises. Then, subjects' lack self-identity entails that Sartre's account does not permit us to reduce what is objective to what is subjective. Subjective attempts at emulating objectivity result in false consciousness (bad faith) whereas enforcing objective identity on the subject leads to alienation (transcendence transcended). Furthermore, as the subject is nothing in relation to the object, it cannot be described as possessing intentional contents -- all of the contents to which the subject can refer in experience are out there in the world. Finally, although human freedom is supposedly due to the lack of self-identity of the subject, it is the lack of self-identity of the subject by contrast with the self-identity of objects on account of which situations in the world appear recalcitrant to the free subject. That is, on Sartre's account, subjects cannot dominate situations without going against their own subjectivity. And this conclusion could be interpreted as an existentialist counterpart to Adorno's materialist claim that subjects cannot dominate the world without going against their own nature. What distinguishes Adorno and Sartre, therefore, is not idealism and identity thinking on the one side and materialism and acknowledgment of the non-identical on the other; both reject idealism in a qualified way and take issue with the identity principle. Gordon's book would have benefited from making clear to what extent Adorno's position converges with the object of his criticisms and to what extent his criticisms have been the product of his tendency to associate existentialism with Heideggerianism.

A similar lack of critical distance affects Gordon's account of Adorno's critique of phenomenology. Husserl comes out as a proto-Heideggerian at times (pp. 69, 76); and Merleau-Ponty makes but a very brief appearance as yet another French Heideggerian who felt the sting of Adorno's reproval when he attended Adorno's lectures in Paris in 1961 (p. 122).

To my mind, Merleau-Ponty was right to be scandalized by Adorno's bulk dismissal of phenomenology. In his Metacritique, Adorno saw Husserlian phenomenology as the embodiment of a final crisis of idealism and thus of bourgeois thought (pp. 39-41). His critique of transcendental phenomenology is unusual because it is motivated by the critique of ideology. This motivation aside, however, most of Adorno's criticisms are familiar from other charges of idealism against Husserlian phenomenology, that is, concerns with its focus on consciousness and with its various attempts to reconstruct the objective world as a correlate of intentional experience. Yet precisely these criticisms chime with phenomenological reservations about Husserl's reductive methodology that are clearly expressed in the works of Merleau-Ponty, Sartre, and others. Some recent authors like Crowell, Rowlands, and Zahavi have suggested along the same lines that transcendental phenomenology can be interpreted as a version of content externalism whose primary interest it is to formulate subjective conditions for open-ended world-bound intentional experiences, not to delimit or control the scope of the objects that we encounter.

This should give us pause with respect to Adorno's critical evaluation of phenomenology. Especially from a contemporary perspective, there is a lot that resists his attack on phenomenology as reductionism and identity thinking. By taking some of these developments into account, Gordon could have drawn a line between what is questionable and obsolete in Adorno's critique of phenomenology and what is of lasting relevance. Aspects of lasting relevance could be, for example, problems with the limited dialectical or critical potential of phenomenological description, an adequate account of embodied subjectivity and its somatic dimension, and concerns with the place of history and society in phenomenological investigation. Some of the traffic might even go the other way. It can be argued that Adorno's immanent critique tacitly exploits elements of phenomenological description to bring out what is of general significance about certain historical and social constellations. So Adorno might have been even closer to phenomenology than Gordon allows us to see. These philosophical potentials remain undeveloped in favor of a picture of Adorno with which those with an interest in phenomenology have little reason to engage.

Finally, as mentioned above, Adorno's concerns with how existentialism panders to bourgeois interiority is a recurrent and unifying theme in Gordon's book. Worries about bourgeois interiority made sense in the 19th century and part of the 20th century where the middle-class could be identified, not just by its place in the socio-economic fabric, but also by its explicit or implicit allegiances with Christianity. It may be doubted, however, whether bourgeois interiority still is an obvious target for the 21st-century critic of ideology. Gordon adopts this term because Adorno deploys it against existentialism and other philosophical opponents, but he does not explore any new sense of bourgeois interiority. This is unhelpful especially if we think that there are good reasons to extend some of Adorno's worries about the wrong life into the present, to be concerned with him about the combination of individualism and indifference that allows us in the West, who are in a position of great comfort, wealth, and safety, to be complacent in the face of the suffering of others elsewhere and among us. And is it really as obvious as Adorno believes -- and Gordon with him -- that phenomenology and existentialism are on the side of what desensitizes us to these troubling aspects of our contemporary condition? Does it seem so unlikely that phenomenological description can help us bring out critically the kinds of agency and experience responsible for current structures of domination, exclusion, exploitation, or alienation? Gordon's unqualified endorsement of Adorno's various critiques of existentialism and phenomenology makes this unnecessarily hard to see.

Gordon's book excels as a detailed and masterful internal reconstruction of the philosophical trajectory that led to Adorno's Negative Dialectics. It makes a truly original contribution to Adorno scholarship by arguing that Adorno's sophisticated and unorthodox materialism crystallized by way of a determinate negation of existentialism. But since the book does not question Adorno's opposition to existentialism, relevant congruencies between his critical theory and phenomenology and existentialism cannot come into view. Especially in light of the recent renaissance of phenomenology, Gordon's book leaves unexplored what is very likely to be the most promising philosophical route towards a renewal of themes from Adorno's thought.