Adorno and the Ends of Philosophy

Placeholder book cover

Andrew Bowie, Adorno and the Ends of Philosophy, Polity Press, 2013, 206pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745671598.

Reviewed by Bert van den Brink, Utrecht University


Andrew Bowie's engaging new book starts from the refreshingly honest statement, printed on the back, that Theodor W. Adorno's "published texts are notably difficult and have tended to hinder his reception by a broad philosophical audience." Many who have had the courage to read Adorno's Dialectic of Enlightenment (1947, with Max Horkheimer), Negative Dialectics (1966), or Aesthetic Theory (1970) will be inclined to agree. Bowie's original approach to tackling the difficulty of the enigmatic famous books is to interpret them in light of Adorno's public lectures and university lectures for students. The lectures discuss the same questions of rationality, history, morality, human kind's relation to nature, dialectical thought and aesthetics as the books do, but do so in a much more accessible vocabulary and style. In his published works, his books especially, Adorno's style closely follows the (negative) dialectical method that structures his arguments and analyses. This often results in series of bold positive statements (e.g., "subjectivity dominates nature") and negations or inversions of such statements (e.g., "nature dominates subjectivity") that hardly ever lead to what most academic philosophers think of as clear conclusions. Adorno was fully aware of the implications of his dialectical style expressing the philosophical content of his writing. Indeed, the seeming logical inconsistencies and generalizing exaggerations that abound in his books are central ingredients of the deconstruction of what he thought of as the naively "uncritical" interests and approaches of philosophy and the social sciences of his day.

It is true that Adorno's lectures from the 1950s and 1960s, which Bowie focuses on, are much easier to read than the (in)famous books are. Bowie's explains why that is in the following way:

The transcripts of lectures from the later 1950s until the later 1960s are very often of improvisations from quite minimal notes on the topics which then became the books, or on topics dealt with in his essays and books. Topics which in his books are often cryptic, unexplained, unnecessarily exaggerated, very often appear in a lucid, developed form in the lectures. Adorno himself has lots to say about why he does not trust lecture presentation, and about why only the written text can appropriately convey a message. However, it seems evident that his pedagogical talent thrived on the dialogical situation, and being compelled to formulate difficult ideas in a manner accessible to students brought out his talent. When he reverts to reading out a text there is often a sense of moving from the dialogical communication of ideas that matter to an esoteric stance in which ideas have to be formulated in a way that makes any kind of coherent summary difficulty. (10-11)

It is disappointing that Bowie has hardly anything more to say about the differences between the lecture transcripts and the books and the use that he makes of them in building up, in the rest of his book, an image of Adorno the philosopher that is cleansed of some of the maddeningly enigmatic inconsistencies and exaggerations at the heart of his published books. Since Gillian Rose's The Melancholy Science (1978), several authors have dug deeply into Adorno's occupation with style, arguing that through his style he illustrates another way of doing philosophy. Bowie rightly points to formal similarities between the later Wittgenstein and Adorno with regard to the relation of content and form in their approaches to philosophy (5). That makes it even more puzzling why he does not relate his choice for focusing on the lectures rather than the received published books to the body of literature on the issue of style in Adorno. Bowie simply states that "The criterion for my use of the texts is simply the degree to which they illuminate the issues at hand." (11)

Luckily, the insufficient attention to the methodological implications of the choice for the lectures does not affect the quality of the book’s six chapters. They concern Adorno's idea of philosophy (1), his relation to Kant (2) and Hegel (3), nature (4), freedom (5), and aesthetics (6). Indeed, judging from the interpretation that Bowie develops throughout these chapters, we may perhaps conclude that the content of Adorno's philosophical thought can indeed be grasped without the reader being hindered by the more outrageous stylistic aspects of some of the published works. But it is regrettable that as readers we have to conclude this for ourselves whereas Bowie could have convinced us of the point through a more solid methodological analysis of and argument for his chosen approach.

There are three interrelated questions that run through all the chapters. The first of these is a question about the ends of philosophy: what are its aims, what is it directed at? Bowie's first conclusion with regard to this question is that according to Adorno, philosophy should be understood as an attempt at critically relating "to a world in which some forms of attempted determination of what there is can themselves have damaging consequences." (181) The attempts at determination can stem from, for instance, political, social, artistic or academic attempts at making our thoughts and practices find some kind of closure. Where practical or theoretical attempts at seeing things from just one perspective, under just one aspect, are successful, philosophy should ask which blindnesses and exclusions occur because of this. And this not just as a critique of practices outside of philosophy but with regard to philosophical theory construction as well. Bowie concludes that according to Adorno philosophy "should build the sense of its own potentially repressive nature into the way in which it is presented." (181). Bowie forcefully brings out this finding in all his chapters, but most convincingly in the engaging thematic chapters on nature, freedom, and aesthetics. Here he excels in not slavishly following the sage's enigmatic statements but in picking up some of his better insights and developing them further. He operationalizes Adorno in a critique of the indeed puzzling tendencies in naturalistic and neuroscientific approaches in contemporary philosophy to let human experience and evaluation vanish from our best philosophical accounts of human thought and action. Developing further older interpretations of Adorno by Albrecht Wellmer and Martin Seel, Bowie shows us how an Adornian analysis of these tendencies could be developed.

Bowie argues that Adorno subscribes to a second end of philosophy: that of making sense of the disenchanted modern world, in which experiences of powerlessness and disenchantment are as frequent and as telling as experiences of ourselves as the autonomous subjects that enlightenment philosophers and liberal ideologues make us out to be. He criticizes both mainstream analytical philosophy and discursively oriented neo-Hegelians such as Robert Pippin for not being able to address such questions because of their conceptual (analytical philosophy, 135-137) and norm-oriented (neo-Hegelians, 58) approaches to philosophical issues. This is said to result in a blindness to questions of sense and meaning as they pose themselves to individuals, and the role that the aesthetic experience of art and music and individual attempts at self-realization may play in making sense of our existence in a disenchanted world.

Bowie convincingly argues that Adorno sees a task for philosophy in helping individuals make sense of the disenchanted world. He approaches this problematic through aesthetics mostly, stressing Adorno's point that art is "the measure of remembrance of all the powers in human beings that are destroyed by the process of rationalization." (152). The chapter on aesthetics is strong, engaging, and clearly close to Bowie's own philosophical interests. But aesthetics is not the only route to making sense and finding meaning. What I missed in Bowie's grappling with these questions is a thorough discussion of Adorno's ethics. J. M. Bernstein's Adorno: Disenchantment and Ethics (2001), Martin Seel's Adorno's Philosophie der Kontemplation (2004) and Fabian Freyenhagen's recent Adorno's Practical Philosophy: Living less Wrongly (2013) have taken bold steps toward a practical philosophy of Adornian sense-making in the disenchanting world. Bowie's book would have been more complete if he had added a chapter on ethics in which Adorno's lectures on the subject were discussed against the background of these recent developments in Adorno research.

A second question that runs through the book is how Adorno's vision of the ends of philosophy relates to views on that question in mainstream analytical philosophy. The way this confrontation is set up seems a bit forced at times since it is so obvious that mainstream analytical philosophy and Adorno have practically nothing in common. The anti-holistic epistemological and conceptual approaches at the core of that tradition mainly serve as a background against which Adorno's alternative positions are sketched. For the Anglophone audience in philosophy, this may well be a good choice. I don't expect that Bowie's book will turn many analytical philosophers into Adornians. But I do expect that the book will be a great help to students of mainly analytically oriented philosophy departments in getting a good grasp of just how different Adorno's way of doing philosophy really is. And that would be a great achievement in itself.

A third question that returns in all chapters is how Adorno's thought relates to recent actualizations of Hegel's philosophy. It is no secret that Adorno's holistic and dialectical approach to questions of knowledge, morality and aesthetics is deeply indebted to Hegel. Still, it is not very close to what authors such as Robert Pippin and Axel Honneth have done in their interpretations of Hegel. What Bowie problematizes by bringing Adorno into play in the interpretation of Hegel is, first, their historically unwarranted longing for a rational end to -- a closure of -- conceptual contradictions and social conflicts and, second, a form of norm-oriented rationalism that must remain blind to aspects of human experience that cannot easily be captured under a norm (Bowie rightly stresses that this second point does not apply to Honneth). Bowie does important work here; not so much in deciding the issue as to which interpretation of Hegel is the better one, but in putting Adorno more prominently on the list of the more radical interpreters of Hegel. His compelling critique of ideological and philosophical closure -- born in the darkest age of the Twentieth Century -- has to be consulted by those who want to actualize Hegel's in the end optimistic philosophy.

Bowie's Adorno and the Ends of Philosophy will appeal to those coming from analytical philosophy with a desire to venture out into the fascinatingly confusing world of continental philosophy and early critical theory. He does an illuminating job of bringing these two worlds together and comparing the very different approaches to philosophy they represent. There will certainly be much interest in that in many philosophy departments in the Anglophone world especially. The book will also speak to those in Adorno research who are interested in how Adorno's published books relate to his public lectures and university lectures. Bowie's book would have been more than the good book it already is had he made more of this excellent opportunity to articulate the methodological scope and limits of giving the lectures pride of place in his reading and rereading of Adorno's philosophy. Maybe this could be added as a postscript to a later edition.